The Moral Significance of Styles of Life

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John Kekes, Enjoyment: The Moral Significance of Styles of Life, Oxford UP, 2008, 289pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199546923.

Reviewed by Jason R. Raibley, California State University - Long Beach



According to John Kekes, “morality involves not merely a set of commands and prohibitions, but also the pursuit of an enjoyable life” (10). The best way of enjoying one’s life as a whole is to develop a style of life that reflects one’s individuality. Such a style is composed of an attitude to life, a set of activities that translate the attitude into practical terms, and a characteristic manner of acting. The early chapters of Enjoyment: The Moral Significance of Styles of Life develop and explain these ideas. The middle chapters explain how reasons of well-being contend with reasons based on universal moral norms and reasons based on one’s narrative identity as a participant in a particular form of life. The later chapters illustrate several styles of life, arguing that some styles of life are inherently problematic.

The book has definite virtues — and definite vices. Kekes grapples with perennial, intrinsically interesting philosophical questions: the nature of well-being and enjoyment and their connection with individuality; the negotiation of conflicts between moral reasons, reasons based on social identity, and reasons of well-being; the formulation of a politics that strikes the right balance between individual liberty and the common good. The book would probably be accessible to many intellectuals outside of professional philosophy. Kekes’ authorial voice is even-keeled and amiable, and his narrative moves briskly along. He is, moreover, a person of wide learning who is capable of discussing history, literature, and biography in an insightful way. But despite these merits — and despite my sympathies with Kekes’ Humean approach to ethics and politics — many of his discussions left me unconvinced. A variety of difficult questions are raised but then not answered in a very rigorous way. In addition, Kekes fails to relate his views on many topics to the work of more recent writers. Doing so might have led him to refine and clarify his views — or even to discover additional arguments in their favor.

In Chapter 2, “Pursuing Our Own Good,” Kekes introduces the concept of a style of life. A style of life does not involve any particular course of action on any particular occasion. Rather, it involves a complex mixture of attitudes, patterns of action, and concomitant manners of acting. When these elements cohere and form a mutually enforcing whole, a style of life can be called “admirable.” If circumstances are favorable, and the admirable style also reflects one’s individuality, then one’s life will be enjoyable and successful.

In Chapter 3, “Personal Evaluation,” Kekes turns to answer the question, Why does enjoyment have such great importance for living a good life? “The short answer,” he writes, “is that enjoyment reflects a favorable attitude to one’s life.” One’s attitude towards life consists in part of a personal evaluation of one’s life: Is one satisfied with it? Does one find it enjoyable? According to Kekes, one’s answers to these questions — which need not be explicit — will depend on how one’s beliefs about what is worthwhile cohere or fail to cohere with one’s emotional responses and motives. Beliefs, emotions, and motives must not merely be consistent but also overlapping, so that they lead one in a particular direction and reinforce one another.

How does one achieve this form of coherence? Kekes’ answer is that one must take stock of one’s basic capacities and the possible roles within one’s society and seek some available role that is well-matched to one’s capacities (reciprocal adjustments of one’s capacities and the existing social conventions may be necessary). Roles involve characteristic actions and goals. If these are appropriate to an individual, “the enjoyment of life follows” (52).

Enjoyment can be said to be “a kind of broadly understood pleasure” (43). However, mere contentment with one’s life does not indicate that I enjoy it: for contentment may reflect resignation. Fulfillment is not the same as enjoyment, because enjoyment is a process and activity, whereas fulfillment is a state. Enjoyment is not the same as happiness, as happiness can be episodic, short-term, and concern only a part of one’s life. Nor is enjoyment success: “A life may be miserable even if its projects are very successful, as was [Jonathan] Swift’s” (50).

In Chapter 4, “The Importance of Manner,” Kekes specifies that what makes particular actions and goals enjoyable is “the manner in which they are done” (52). The same types of actions can be performed in different ways. The Kantian “knight of duty” performs apparently beneficent actions, but not with the same constellation of sentiments and motives as a caring physician. The correct manner of acting is only possible to a person whose self is undivided, unlike the Kantian who is struggling against his inclinations. In order to have such an undivided self, one’s attitude to life must be realistic and coherent.

One’s attitude to life must be realistic in that it must involve goals and projects that are (a) available in one’s society, and (b) such that one has the “ability to realize [them] with a reasonable hope of at least moderate success” (57). Later, Kekes implies that a realistic attitude is only possible to one who has chosen his particular goals and projects in light of an informed survey of his options: “Realism involves the recognition of all and only possible lives that are available to one, given one’s capacities and social context” (78). One’s attitude to life must also be coherent: the attitude must spring from beliefs and emotions that coexist harmoniously and jointly motivate efficacious action (56). In addition, in order for a life to be favorably evaluated, “its dominant activities must be enjoyable” (59). (This does seem at least partly circular: Kekes has explained an enjoyable life in terms of a manner of acting that is based on a realistic and coherent attitude to life whose dominant activities are also enjoyable.)

A necessary — though not sufficient — condition for an enjoyable life is the possession of individuality. This is because individuality is, practically speaking, a precondition for acting in the manner that makes particular actions and goals enjoyable. In Kekes’ view, individuality is not about being distinct from others or unique. Rather, it is about “being true to oneself,” i.e., having projects that reflect one’s deepest and most enduring beliefs and emotions, and having the motives to match (61). Once again, these beliefs and emotions must be realistic and coherent, as well as durable, in order for one to sustain one’s individuality.

Individuality is not mere authenticity, for authenticity does not require realistic or coherent projects. A bohemian dreamer with terribly unrealistic, non-compossible projects might be authentic. Individuality also differs, according to Kekes, from autonomy. Autonomy involves identification with a principle or with certain values; individuality requires that one’s commitments be expressive of oneself and so therefore enjoyable (69-70). Kant’s knight of duty might be autonomous, but if he selflessly follows a moral code that leaves him cold and uninspired, he does not have individuality.

Individuality makes life enjoyable to an even higher degree because it enables one to avoid those incoherences that lead to frustration, and also because “the unimpeded exercise of one’s natural capacities … completes one’s nature” (62). The nature in question is one’s individual nature, not one’s nature qua member of the human species. One completes one’s individual nature when one’s manner of living reflects what one most deeply cares about. Here again, what makes the relevant activities enjoyable is “not the identity or success of our projects, but the manner in which we are engaged in them” (71). Still, individuality is not sufficient for high levels of well-being because a clear-headed appraisal of what we most deeply care about might horrify us if our attitude to life is incoherent, and because luck is also necessary: “accidents, disasters, social upheavals, epidemics, and so forth” may frustrate enjoyment (66). Corresponding to the possible forms of individuality there are different styles of life.

In Chapter 5, “A Great and Rare Art,” Kekes also deals with two important objections to his account. Richard Taylor asks us to suppose that God implanted a device in Sisyphus’ brain that causes him to have a passionate urge to roll his boulder up the hill. If Sisyphus had this urge, and acted on it, then it would seem that he was instantiating individuality, living in accordance with his deepest concerns, and that his life would be enjoyable on an account like Kekes’.

Kekes responds: “But Sisyphus’ attitude to his life is not really his; it does not reflect his individual nature; it is the outcome of the implant that deceives Sisyphus and makes his miserable life falsely appear enjoyable. His enjoyment, however, is illusory” (78). Explaining his justification for this claim, Kekes writes that Sisyphus’ implant does not meet the conditions of realism and coherence:

The implant made Sisyphus incapable of recognizing possibilities other than boulder-rolling. If he had recognized [his other possibilities], … he would have been bound to ask himself why he preferred the boulder-rolling one and how he could find it enjoyable compared to other modes of living. And, if he had asked these questions, they would have led him to question his implanted attitude to his boulder-rolling life. (78)

Similarly, Sisyphus fails to meet the coherence constraint:

The implant caused him to feel a passionate urge … that … silenced questions that normal people would ask if they suddenly found themselves badly wanting to spend their life engaging in such a pointless and miserable activity… . [This] compulsion did not reflect his individuality; it squelched his contrary beliefs, emotions, and motives; and made him the slave of an unnatural urge. (78)

Kekes then makes things even more difficult for himself. He discusses Joel Feinberg’s modification of the Sisyphus case: suppose God changed Sisyphus’ “nature in such a way as to make boulder-rolling a natural expression of it. That is what he comes to genuinely want to do as the dominant activity of his life” (79). It seems that this version of Sisyphus has a coherent, realistic, and durable attitude to life that will give rise to an enjoyable style of life.

In response, Kekes adds a further distinction to his theory, a distinction between “admirable and deficient forms of enjoyment.” All but the most misfortunate face choices and have multiple opportunities. Since the choices we make “are either reasonable or unreasonable, the resulting enjoyments may be more or less admirable or deficient” (81). If Feinberg’s account of Sisyphus is the account of an individual who does not face such choices, Kekes says, then it is too unrealistic to serve as a counterexample to his (Kekes’) theory. If Taylor’s Sisyphus does face choices, then we can criticize Sisyphus because he has not made choices that in the long run will make his life as enjoyable as it might be (81).

Adequate styles of life must also reflect forms of life that take into account “basic physiological, psychological, and social needs that all normal human beings have always, everywhere … These needs are created by human nature, not by a form of life” (90). These needs are present whether a person chooses to acknowledge them or not, so a style of life that is out of sync with them will eventually emerge as incoherent and unenjoyable.

A style of life can be justified on the basis of the agent’s own “sensitivity or vision” (86). A style of life can also be justified on the basis of “external evaluations,” i.e., evaluations by others of the agent’s style of life, provided that the agent “indeed [has] the sensitivity or personal vision that makes what others adduce a reason” (84). We should be open to external evaluations, as they can help us overcome self-deception, wishful thinking, fear, thoughtlessness, lethargy and other obstacles to refining our individuality and the coherence of our attitudes.

In Chapter 6, “Three-Dimensional Morality,” Kekes argues that morality has three, interrelated dimensions. The first dimension is the universal dimension, which involves “the satisfaction of basic needs that are the same for all human beings at all times and places and under all circumstances” (96). The second dimension is the social dimension, which concerns conventions that answer to universal human needs but that may legitimately vary among different forms of life. Norms based on one’s personal attachments, ethnicity, religion, career, hobbies, citizenship, or musical and literary culture answer to universal needs, but there is no particular set of such norms that is rationally mandatory for all persons. Still, such norms do provide reasons for particular, culturally embedded individuals. The third dimension of morality concerns “individuals making an enjoyable life for themselves” (101). This third dimension of morality does bring along with it responsibilities: one has a responsibility, for example, to develop a style of life that reflects a coherent, realistic, and durable attitude to life (102). If Sidgwick is a practical dualist, Kekes is a practical trialist: he thinks that norms from all three dimensions provide genuine reasons for action. He also holds that no particular mode of evaluation will always override the others (138).

What ought one to do when norms from different dimensions provide conflicting guidance? In Chapter 7, “The Uses of Reason in Morality,” Kekes argues that there is no higher point of view from which conflicts among the three dimensions can be easily reconciled. In a concrete circumstance, many actions will be rationally permissible, and some will be rationally impermissible (131). It will be quite rare to find an action that is rationally required (129). In cases of conflict, we are required to resolve the conflict “one way or another, but it rarely happens that reason requires resolving [it] in favor of one of the conflicting goods” (131). Because such conflicts are possible, the perfect life is not (132). However, we can aim at a balance among goods that gives us as much of them each as possible in a particular situation, or that at least minimizes damage (134).

Discovering our individuality and the style of life best suited to it is a complicated and difficult business. We start out, Kekes writes, “with chaotic, imprecise, inarticulate beliefs and feelings about our ill-defined needs, wants, desires, hopes, and fears.” To clarify them, we must “draw distinctions, identify possibilities and limits, feel our way into various forms of life” (260). Reflection on biography and literature is indispensable for broadening our understanding of the possibilities of life, argues Kekes. This is so because we know only a small number of people personally, and travel and journalistic accounts of the lives of others provide only brief and superficial glimpses into other forms of life. Literary classics constitute “the accumulated experiences of our moral tradition — the means by which we can learn about others” (263).

Accordingly, in chapters 8-13, Kekes presents and discusses several styles of life drawn from biography and literature. He argues that certain styles of life are admirable as such, on account of the particular attitudes they involve and the relations among these attitudes. These include the style life of Madame Goesler (“integrity”), a character in Anthony Trollope’s parliamentary novels, and the style of life of David Hume (“reflectivity,” combined with mitigated skepticism). Other styles of life are inherently defective. These include the style of Yukio Mishima (“morbid romanticism”), a Japanese novelist who botched his own suicide, and Cato (inflexible “moralism”).

In the final chapter, Kekes argues that the cultivation of a style of life is our best hope for dealing with the contingency of the human predicament. If we find out what matters most to us and live accordingly — i.e., if we have a realistic and coherent attitude towards life — we increase our control over

the small segment of the world that is in our power: our inner life. The more control we have over it, the greater is our … freedom from contingency … we can remain true to ourselves, reflective, self-directed, and enjoy life even if illness, accidence, misfortune, grief, or disappointment assails us, and even if we suffer injustice, cruelty, hostility, or humiliation. (259)

If we cultivate a style of life, then even if we fail or encounter grave misfortune, we will have “the satisfaction of knowing that we have done what we could and our miseries are caused by the indifferent forces of nature of which it is our bad luck to have fallen afoul” (270). Kekes argues that this approach, which he calls “realism,” navigates a course between the false consolations of religion and ideology and the nihilism of the postmodernists.

This is a wide-ranging book. In the space that remains, I would like to discuss further a few of the points on which I was unsatisfied with Kekes’ account.

One difficulty with Kekes’ view of well-being concerns the relation between positive self-appraisal and enjoyment. Kekes’ formulations suggest that he is trying to merge a life-satisfaction or self-assessment approach to well-being with an approach based on enjoyment. The first of these sorts of theories says that you are doing well just in case you (steadily) judge that you are satisfied with your life. The second says that you are doing well to the degree that you enjoy your life or the events and circumstances that comprise it. Kekes seems to want to say that you will enjoy your life if and only if you judge that it is satisfying (52). But Kekes also writes that there is “a fact” about “whether or not our life is on the whole enjoyable,” irrespective of what we think about it (46). This opens up the possibility of someone evaluating her life in positive terms while not really enjoying it. If Kekes is correct that this is possible — and I think he is — then many of his formulations need revision.

Kekes helpfully contrasts enjoyment with some other attitudes and states. But he makes a number of striking claims about the connection between individuality and enjoyment, and it is never made clear whether Kekes is proposing a conceptual connection between the two, some sort of nomological connection, or merely a statistical regularity. For example, he writes: “the unimpeded pursuit of possibilities of life … which we believe and feel reflect our deepest concerns is in itself enjoyable” (68). When explaining why this is so, Kekes writes that the pursuit of impossibilities or incoherent possibilities is doomed to frustration (68). Well, that is certainly true. But that does not establish that the pursuit of coherent possibilities will lead to enjoyment. Later, Kekes adds that a style of life is “enjoyable because it expresses the individuality and deepest concerns of the person who is fortunate enough to have been able to develop it” (76). This is frequently true. But it is also conceivable that a person live a life that expresses her deepest concerns while not finding it enjoyable. Consider a parent who makes great sacrifices for her children. This might be the action that is required by her deepest values, but the sacrifices themselves might be extremely painful. It seems possible that such a person’s life turn out to be unenjoyable, on balance.

A second problem with Kekes’ account of well-being concerns coherence or consistency. Kekes writes that the purest forms of individuality and enjoyment are accessible only to those with totally coherent beliefs, attitudes, and emotions. But at the same time, he writes that it is “inadvisable to be fanatical about our attitude to life … an enjoyable life should have room for play, curiosity, and entertainment. It is tiring and tiresome to be always independent, wholehearted, or creative” (39). This tension is not resolved. There is also an issue about coherence in one’s attitudes over time. Kekes writes that the “self to which individuality consists in being true is a coherent, realistic, durable self” (68). Sometimes, though, when a person reassesses his past actions and attitudes, he might rightfully judge that further conformity to those attitudes would be bad for him. While Kekes acknowledges the possibility of such radical change, many of his formulations imply that a life that involves change is ipso facto lacking in individuality, enjoyment, and therefore well-being — which seems questionable (147).

In Kekes’ responses to Taylor and Feinberg, and later in his discussion of Mishima’s style of life, I believe he overstates the resources his view has for criticizing styles of life.

Kekes is free to stipulate that for one’s attitude towards life to be “realistic” one must take into account all the things one might have done and make an informed choice on this basis. Kekes may even be correct that, if (Taylor’s version of) Sisyphus were to do this, he would be miserable. But I am not sure that an enjoyable life — or a life high in personal well-being — really does require a realistic attitude in this sense, i.e., taking into account all the things one might do with one’s life, and making a judgment about how to live on that basis. Surely there are many well-off people who more or less lucked into finding projects that fit their individual natures. Kekes’ account implies that their lives would necessarily be less enjoyable for this. This is not plausible.

Kekes’ response to Feinberg is also unconvincing. He claims that Sisyphus’ enjoyment of boulder-rolling is deficient — akin to counting the words in the daily newspaper (80) — because this version of Sisyphus has not made choices that in the long run will make his life as enjoyable as it might be. But if his nature is changed — as Feinberg stipulates — so that he delights in rolling the boulder up the hill over and over again, and he is aware of the match between his nature and this activity, then he might make an informed and considered choice for boulder-rolling. Even if boulder-rolling is an activity that fails to promote the satisfaction of human needs, generally, it does not frustrate them. And in any case, if the reason that needs-frustrating styles of life are deficient is that they are unsustainable for individuals (because out of sync with human nature), that does not seem like a problem, here: Sisyphus had his nature changed. Consequently, by Kekes’ own account, we could not call this form of enjoyment deficient. But perhaps Kekes should just embrace this conclusion: after all, many enjoyable and worthwhile lives involve repetitious activities.

Kekes shows that his basically subjectivist, internalist approach to well-being has significant resources for criticizing styles of life. For example, Kekes convincingly shows that Cato’s life went poorly for him because of an inconsistency in his personal values and a lack of self-knowledge that prevented him from recognizing this inconsistency. He also makes a strong case that Madame Goesler and Hume — who seem to have lived enjoyable lives that were high in personal well-being — had styles of life in just his sense, and that the realism and coherence of their concomitant attitudes helped to make their lives enjoyable. However, other discussions of the critical and explanatory resources of his view are less successful. Mishima, for example, seems to have lived an unenjoyable life that went badly for him. Kekes’ view has something to say about why: for Mishima’s own remarks about the widening split in his personality seem to indicate that his attitudes lacked coherence (170). But Kekes writes that morbidity and romanticism are intrinsically deficient styles of life, and that this was the problem with Mishima’s life. This is not convincingly demonstrated. In fact, Kekes’ own account would seem to be more closely related to romanticism than he wishes to admit: for it is also based on the idea that “each man shall be true to his own goals” (Berlin, quoted on 174).

A final problem with Kekes’ book is that it contains little discussion of more recent philosophical work on the very topics he discusses. Except for the works of L. W. Sumner, Kekes does not discuss any contemporary literature on personal well-being. (I would be interested to know, for example, how Kekes would evaluate the developmentalism recently advocated by Richard Kraut; for Kekes also appeals to the idea that “the unimpeded exercise of one’s natural capacities is enjoyable because it completes one’s nature” 62). Kekes does not relate his thinking on enjoyment to, e.g., the recent works of Roger Crisp, Fred Feldman, or Daniel Haybron, which draw helpful, fine-grained distinctions between various forms of pleasure, enjoyment, satisfaction, and happiness. Similarly, Kekes’ discussions of self-knowledge and moral psychology could have been improved by engagement with classic works by Harry Frankfurt, Gary Watson, Peter Railton, and Michael Bratman. (None of these writers is even cited!) Kekes would probably also find much that would interest him in the more recent writings of Connie Rosati, Nomy Arpaly, and Valerie Tiberius, among others. Finally, Kekes mentions and endorses a form of ethical particularism, but he does not locate his thinking in relation to the recent works of Jonathan Dancy or David McNaughton — or the debate surrounding these works.

In Enjoyment: The Moral Significance of Styles of Life, John Kekes articulates a panoramic vision of moral life — a vision that will be appealing to many readers. He also illustrates what important resources literature and biography are for moral philosophy, particularly for those who accept his particularism and pluralism. The synthetic abilities that are required for Kekes’ style of philosophical thinking and writing are perhaps undervalued in professional philosophy at present. But analytical acumen is also valuable and necessary, and in many spots, Kekes does not work out his views in a very rigorous way. Nor does he engage with the more recent philosophical literature on the topics he discusses, which would likely have forced him to be more clear and precise.