The Morality of Peacekeeping

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Daniel H. Levine, The Morality of Peacekeeping, Edinburgh University Press, 2014, 362pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748697199.

Reviewed by Melissa Bergeron, United States Military Academy at West Point


The central conceit of Daniel Levine's book is that peacekeeping "can combine non-enmity with coercion" (13) and he concludes that "we should always keep in mind that there are other practices to hold people responsible besides punishment and defeat" (325). These sentiments bookend more than three hundred pages of anecdotes, United Nations charters, and interviews from recent developments in peacekeeping operations (PKO). It is an extraordinary collection of narratives by peacekeepers stationed in India and across Africa. But, as Levine himself acknowledges, "To the extent that there is any reason to believe what I say, it is because a persuasive argument stands behind it, not because it represents a consensus of peacekeepers or analysts" (19), and so this review cleaves closely to this standard and attends, rather narrowly, to proffered arguments.

It seems only fair, however, to highlight what might prove to be a relevant methodological difference between what Levine takes to be a satisfactory argument and the standard adopted by the moral philosophers and just war theorists he cites. An earlier reviewer opined that this work "seemed to be an odd mixture of empirical research and personal opinion,"to which Levine apparently takes no umbrage, commenting approvingly that this "is probably as good a description of applied ethics as any" (17). Prima facie, granting the necessity of supporting arguments, on the one hand, and allowing that mere personal opinion, even buttressed by empirical research, might constitute the substance of those arguments, on the other, is odd. One suspects that this is perhaps only a playful gibe at applied ethics. Still, this remains a decidedly impressionistic work that does not apply the philosophical theories mentioned so much as gesture toward possible points of application. A reader searching for rigorous arguments should bear this in mind.

Levine's thesis is inspired by Kant. The interview data and anecdotes, according to Levine, provide the substance for a sort of Rawlsian "reflective equilibrium," whereby the deliverances of theory might be tempered by the reflections of peacekeepers -- "If the intuition seems too strong or credible to reject" (18) -- but he never identifies the sort of intuition that might justify altering theory. Indeed, there is no further mention of Rawls, though the failure to discuss the Kantian underpinning to Rawls' work foreshadows similar misapprehensions regarding the theories of Walzer, Korsgaard, and Kant. The focus of this review centers on the difficulty of accepting Levine's thesis -- eminently intuitive on its own -- given this Kantian gap.

Levine's claim that a peacekeeper can be coercive with belligerents and civilians without seeking their military defeat "undermines one of the traditional assumptions of just war theory -- that combatantcy is a persistence status" (22), and he cites Walzer's "Naked Soldiers" discussion, explaining that

Walzer relates several anecdotes of soldiers finding themselves with a good shot at an enemy soldier who is engaged in some very human, often biological and/or embarrassing, activity rather than directly fighting. . . . In these cases the authors of the anecdotes often chose not to fire.  . . . So long as someone is an enemy, in this view, it is always permissible to kill him or her. (22)

While it is true that it is always permissible to kill a combatant,[1] this misses a crucial (albeit subtle) aspect of Walzer's argument -- a decidedly Kantian notion of humanity. Compare Levine's gloss to what Walzer says about the snipers who fail to kill when the opportunity presents itself:

The refusal of these five men, nevertheless, seems to go to the heart of the war convention. For what does it mean to say that someone has a right to life? To say that is to recognize a fellow creature, who is not threatening me, whose activities have the savor of peace and camaraderie, whose person is as valuable as my own. An enemy has to be described differently, and though the stereotypes through which he is seen are often grotesque, they have a certain truth. He alienates himself from me when he tries to kill me, and from our common humanity. But the alienation is temporary, the humanity imminent. It is restored, as it were, by [these] prosaic acts. . .[2]

In becoming a combatant, particular actions ordinarily required to justify attack (i.e., posing a specific, interpersonal threat) no longer ground the permissibility of killing in combat. Walzer does not grant that an enemy is an "adversary [who] intends to negate his opponent's way of life."[3] Walzer is clear that war is rarely an existential struggle in this sense.[4] And, the morality of the relationship between individual soldiers is not, pace Levine, "governed entirely by the political relationship between their states" (23). Several pages later, in the same chapter, Walzer insists that

soldiers are suppose to accept (some) risks in order to save civilian lives. It is not a question of going out of their way or of being, or not being, good samaritans. They are the ones who endanger civilian lives in the first place . . .[5]

The humanity of the combatant is, in some respects, attenuated. She willingly makes herself dangerous to others (and also willingly courts danger on behalf of others). Noncombatants are not to be targeted, on grounds that they do not enter in to the business of fighting.[6] It is worth belaboring this matter because Walzer's notion of the combatant/noncombatant distinction has nothing to do with the value of the person who is being targeted, the values he does or doesn't share with his enemy, or the existential threat of war. This sphere of rights is a consequence of consent and collective responsibility. Just war theory is bifurcated, responsibility according to the role the agent consents to play. Fighters are responsible for how wars are waged and sovereigns are responsible for the decision to wage war. Combatants must distinguish between other combatants and noncombatants, but it is not viable that their discriminations be more fine-grained than that. Ought implies can, as moral philosophers are wont to insist, and one cannot reasonably be expected to determine whether the bathing soldier is a begrudging conscript or Attila the Hun. A person can, however, reasonably be expected to distinguish the farmer whose lower forty paratroopers just converted into a battlefield from enemy combatants.

It is a mistake, however, to suppose that the "specific rules of conduct between enemies" are rules "because they are agreed upon (the rules of jus in bello)" (23). Jus in bello obligations are not rules by fiat. The specific weapons and tactics barred reflect an attempt to limit the carnage, without undermining the function, of war. Fragmenting rounds, e.g., are no more effective for waging war, that is, for achieving the objective of military victory than less painful, less protracted deaths precipitated by ordinary rounds. There is no practical gain, yet the moral cost is clear. The just war theory holds that death at the hands of another combatant is not inherently inhumane, but intentionally endeavoring to alienate one from his own humanity, to reduce him to a writhing animal, is. It is more apt to say that such limits are discovered than that they are "agreed to."

There seems a related confusion in Levine's discussion of Korsgaard. Kantian humanity is a capacity, the ability to formulate and act according to maxims. All animals act according to inclination, responding to the pushes and pulls of nature. But only human animals, persons, have reasons for their actions, can appreciate the force of reasons. This is the source of our value -- to others and to ourselves, according to Korsgaard. Persons, at least sometimes, can think of ourselves as selves and will the sorts of selves we shall be in taking X as a reason to Φ. Levine reverses this order in claiming that Korsgaard "argues that values can be seen as generally arising from relationships" (52), apparently in distinction to arising privately within the individual. But this is a false contrast. Persons matter, on the Kantian view, because only persons are normative beings. Were there no persons in the world, there could be no normativity, there could be no reasons[7] (for there would be no beings to traffic in the normative). It is important to emphasize that it is not what we value (or whether what we value is shared or understood by others) that constitutes the foundation of the Kantian system. Ergo, values emerge out of relationship only in the formal (or logical) sense that the possibility of moral duty requires a person who is entitled to moral deference,[8] whose personhood obligates the personhood in me. There is nothing necessitating that we understand "respect as embedding shared values in relationships and cooperative, reciprocal action" (53).

The very notion of consent is crucial to the Kantian system precisely because it is the actualization of taking X as a reason for Φ, of being normative. By extension, seeking and honoring the consent of another just is to respect the autonomy or humanity of the other. Only in this way do we treat one another as persons and not as mere animals. Given this, Levine's notion of "building rather than securing consent" (81) for coercive treatment of the citizenry by a PKO is worrisome. If it were the case that there might be "incomplete consent, contested consent, and continued peacekeeper action in the face of deteriorating consent," (76), then a great deal more must be said in defense of the claim that PKO is a Kantian enterprise after all, for Kantian consent is categorical, making the notion of "contested consent" incoherent.

There is an analogue to this problem within social contract theory, rather conspicuously absent from Levine's discussion, which likens the obligations obtaining between citizen and sovereign to that of a contract. Problematically, there rarely is anything sufficiently explicit corresponding to a binding contract to justify the coercive demands of the state.[9] One might endeavor to cash out consent in terms of implied, hypothetical, idealized, etc., models, thus avoiding the problem of lacking explicit consent, but some account must be given. The most enthusiastic endorsement of Levine's intent -- and there is much to his conservative, peace-centric approach to be enthusiastic about -- cannot substitute for this indispensable component of a legitimate PKO.

A Kantian has an advantage in meeting this challenge (and just war theory of the Walzerian stripe follows suit), since the primitive ethical obligation is to humanity, to persons as such. Thus the need to secure the permission of a humanity-disparaging sovereign is theoretically unnecessary; this is the classical view of armed humanitarian intervention and the basis for international humanitarian law. It is the human rights of the citizens that confer legitimacy upon the sovereign. The state cannot be an abuser of those legitimacy-conferring rights-bearers and not thereby surrender sovereignty, lose legitimacy. This is by no means unproblematic. Identifying the criteria for such consent in the context of coercive treatment of precisely those agents who putatively are both the beneficiaries of intervention and the seat of consent is difficult. But while the details might elude, the principle is plain enough. Without the Kantian foundation of humanity -- i.e., normative capacity itself, not shared projects or overlapping values -- the basis for intervention seems unmoored, hopelessly relativistic. Varying grades of consent cannot plaster over the cracks.

Problems emerging out of this Kantian gap are not limited to matters of consent. Levine's objection to punishment as a means of PKO seems a consequence of rejecting the admittedly unintuitive Kantian notion of punishment, what he glibly dismisses as "a mystical way of resetting the moral balance" (48). But punishment on the Kantian view is not power lorded over the weak for their recalcitrance, nor is it some bald gesture toward metaphysical equilibrium. It is the cost of granting the inalienable right of a person (of mature age and sound mind) to be the author of her own reasons, to decide what shall be the Xs and the Φs as she co-legislates the moral realm with the rest of us. Minimally, to respect her autonomy is to treat her according to the maxims that she sanctions, according to the policies she legislates for herself -- even when we do not agree. To punish a fellow law-giver, oddly, is to persist in granting her autonomy and her accountability. Punishment is a manifestation of respect. The immature and the incapable we keep in tutelage; competent agents we meet on their own terms.

The relevant intuition for Rawlsian reflective equilibrium, unspecified by Levine, is Kantian. Should the deliverances of theory, say, the apparent requirement that PKOs secure the consent of a genocidal despot in order to render aid to his victims, prove inconsistent with the core Kantian insight that persons are beings of dignity, entitled to respect, then equilibrium is restored by adjusting the theory. Korsgaard's work is, among other things, an attempt to demonstrate that this Kantian intuition is not merely one theoretical commitment among others but a necessary condition for any sort of reason-taking.

Finally, Levine is surely right that whatever we say about PKOs, it makes no sense to suppose that they appropriately strive for the enemy's defeat -- particularly if the latter is understood as blotting out of existence a people's way of life. But neither is there any reason to suppose that this is a legitimate military end. Killing enemy combatants is a means to the defeat of the enemy (which, if one's war is just, is to repel an aggressor as a last resort to vindicating human rights), but it is not an end in itself.

[1] Though we must be careful to observe the circumstances that neutralize one’s combatant status, e.g., surrendering, being captured, being incapacitated, in which case it would be murder.

[2] Michael Walzer, Just and Unjust Wars (New York: Basic Books, 2006), p. 142. Emphasis added.

[3] Levine, op. cit., p. 22., quoting Schmitt as holding the same “traditional” view as Walzer.

[4] “War is not always a struggle over ultimate values, where the victory of one side would be a human disaster for the other.” Walzer, op. cit., p. 253.

[5] Walzer, op. cit., p. 151.  Emphasis added.

[6] Though should they enter the fray, it is permissible to target them, not because they become proper combatants, but because not even combatants must simply accept their death.

[7] Or perhaps it is best to say 'reason-taking'.

[8] Though, as a person myself, I have obligations to the humanity residing in me.

[9] Military enlistment, civil service, political office, and naturalization constitute instances of unproblematic (i.e., explicit) consent to various civic obligations.