The Movement of Nihilism: Heidegger's Thinking After Nietzsche

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Laurence Paul Hemming, Bogdan Costea, and Kostas Amiridis (eds.), The Movement of Nihilism: Heidegger's Thinking After Nietzsche, Continuum, 2011, 189pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441168092.

Reviewed by Jeffrey L. Powell, Marshall University


The collection of essays composing The Movement of Nihilism attempts to provide an account of the present political condition as an expression of "the movement of nihilism." The genesis of the volume occurred under special, enviable conditions: a Lancaster University sponsored dialogue between numerous scholars from a variety of disciplines and academic institutions. The collection consists of a total of eleven essays, including the introduction, with varying degrees of success in accomplishing its stated goal. Of those eleven, I would cite three as being particularly noteworthy, the essays by Miguel de Beistegui, Jeff Malpas, and Mark Sinclair. The introduction to the collection apparently seeks two different goals: First, it sets the stage for the essays by way of stating the three questions around which they were gathered; second, it provides a brief discussion of Emmanuel Faye's Heidegger: The Introduction of Nazism into Philosophy. The latter exhibits an example or two of why we should not believe Faye, nor follow Faye's orders to shun the work of Heidegger. The remaining seven essays offer varying degrees of success, some suffering from a variety of ills ranging from a lack of clarity and the kind of specious language sometimes associated with Heidegger to a lack of rigor, overstatement, a failure to supply reasonable evidence for claims made, and unfulfilled promises.

Given such problems, it should also be kept in mind that success in such an endeavor is fraught with problems from the beginning. That is, if the present political condition is determined by nihilism, is it enough to provide an analysis that purports to overcome nihilism? Stated more simply, is nihilism something that can be resolved, or is the very attempt at such resolution determined by nihilism? The editors of the collection seem well aware of the extent of the influence of nihilism. Citing Nietzsche's Notebooks, they draw attention to and seemingly endorse Nietzsche's insight that "nihilism as a normal state of affairs" (p. 1). If this is indeed the case, then how might it be possible to take a stance outside nihilism for the purpose of overcoming it or even accounting for it? If nihilism determines the present historical condition, and if its essential mark is what Nietzsche called "the revenge against time and its 'it was'" (Zarathustra), to where might thought step in attempting to transcend it? More cynically, by what trick might one get around it?

The expression "the movement of nihilism" is attributed to Heidegger's problematization of nihilism in his essay on Ernst Jünger. Heidegger's confrontation with nihilism is certainly not limited to this essay, a point affirmed in the various essays that make up this volume. The problem, although not necessarily the name, is in Heidegger's mind as early as the 1929 "What is Metaphysics?" One can certainly argue for an earlier date insofar as the "problem" of nihilism is inseparable from the nothing, but 1929 seems to me a date in which the full force of the question first arises in a form consistent with all the subsequent formulations offered by Heidegger. That being said, "nihilism as a normal state of affairs" would mean that all Heidegger's preceding texts, lecture-courses, etc. were equally under that force. This is not to say that those writings necessarily failed to be determined by the essence of nihilism, rather than simply running counter to its essence, for if Being and Time makes advances within the history of metaphysics, and I believe that it does, then it does so only insofar as it is determined from out of that essence. More generally, if "the movement of nihilism" is to advance beyond a simple repetition of the same, then it will do so only insofar as it is engaged in a confrontation with the essence of nihilism. Stated differently, the attempt to surpass nihilism is the classic move of nihilism. This is what Heidegger, following Nietzsche, insists time and again, beginning especially with the Nietzsche lectures. The final part of the second volume of the Nietzsche lectures is particularly telling in this regard. What is equally telling, although even more rarely taken into account, is David Krell's extensive analysis of that second part following his translation of it. Whatever the merit of the essays in this collection, none of them, with the possible exception of de Beistegui's, matches the insight and erudition of Krell's analysis.

The first essay beyond the introduction, the "The Movement of Nihilism as Self-Assertion" by Bogdan Costea and Kostas Amiridis, begins with some confusion regarding its intent. It first draws a distinction between two kinds of nihilism understood by Nietzsche: "on the one hand, destruction, annihilation and decay; on the other hand, 'classical nihilism' as the condition of a 'new valuation', a 'perfected' nihilism" (p. 9). The essay then indicates its concern to be the first kind. The authors then briefly indicate a need to address the "who" of nihilism, the nature of the subject of nihilism. The authors then add to their purported focus. Rather than a concern for just the first kind of nihilism, they state "What we are trying to understand is whether there is a way of addressing the concerns of the two formulations (of 'destruction' over against a revaluation of all values hitherto')" (p. 9). Its discussion of either form of nihilism remains incomplete, hardly even ventured. Most of the essay concerns the "who" of nihilism, and here the reply is reasonable insofar as the "who" of modernity is viewed as the subject of modernity, the subject engaged in self-assertion. For the authors, this subject is the Cartesian "I" in all its glory. This would be helpful if the authors proposed a way in which the analysis of the "who" determined either form of nihilism, but they do not.

The next essay, Laurence Paul Hemming's "Heidegger's 'Movement of Nihilism' as Political and Metaphysical Critique," has much going for it. It is faithful to the general contours of Heidegger's thinking, while also offering insightful analyses of Heidegger's readings of Heraclitus, Plato, Aristotle, and Nietzsche. Hemming works through some of the details of these analyses in a concerted, critical, intuitive manner. His essay, along with that of de Beistegui, keeps its gaze on the political in its treatment of nihilism. Its great merit is not so much what we might call a thinking of the political "after" Heidegger (nor does Hemming claim it to be), but that he contextualizes the political in Heidegger through a rendering of Heidegger's treatment of the relation of Dasein to the political. According to Hemming, all praxis has an end, the end of all praxis is the good, and the good of Dasein is the meaning of being: "As the meaning of being it [the good] arises on the basis of what Heidegger calls Miteinandersein, the being-with-one-another, being-in-the-polis" (p. 34).

In the midst of two claims for which he fails to provide support, Thomas Rohkrämer's "Fighting Nihilism through Promoting a New Faith: Heidegger within the Debates of His Time" offers a historical contextualization of Heidegger's political sentiments that is reasonable and convincing. What is more, Rohkrämer provides a convincing story for how Heidegger was engaged in the politics of his day. The two claims with which I would take issue are that Heidegger had a "desire for a single communal faith" (p. 40) and held "that a change in attitude is all that is needed to turn technology into a positive force" (p. 49). While Heidegger's confrontation with technology was not concerned with a simple abandonment of technology (as if something of the sort could even be possible), this does not mean a simple change in attitude, for such a change would result from a kind of subjective decision (among many other reasons). To put it simply, the essence of technology is tied to a metaphysical ground associated with the first beginning; the transformation of such a ground is necessary for the transition to an other beginning. With regard to a single communal faith, I see no place in which Heidegger even addressed such a concern. In fact, as early as The Phenomenology of Religious Life, Heidegger was concerned with a religion or faith only insofar as it either escaped the confines of traditional communal faith or called for a singular response to the flight of the gods. Heidegger’s saying in the Spiegel interview that "Only a god can save us now" is hardly justification for something resembling communal faith, as much as Rohkrämer would have us believe otherwise.

Despite all the bantering about Heidegger and politics, the next essay by de Beistegui is virtually the first in the English language to direct its attention to the second part of Heidegger's Die Geschichte des Seyns, to the part entitled "Koinon: Aus der Geschichte des Seyns."[1] Following Heidegger's critique of communism, which Heidegger views as joining hands with the various forms of nihilism (Christianity, Americanism, Bolshevism) inasmuch as they all become reducible to a will-to-power, de Beistegui offers a brief, too brief, presentation of what might well be one of the more fruitful areas of future Heidegger scholarship: the otherwise-than-power (Ohnmacht) in response to will-to-power. If will-to-power is characteristic of the metaphysics of nihilism, as it is for Heidegger, then Ohnmacht should be viewed as a transition from such metaphysical ground, the transition signaling a crossing-over from the metaphysics of power to an other beginning as otherwise than power. This otherwise than power,Ohnmacht, which Heidegger addresses in GA69, is situated by de Beistegui in Heidegger's thinking of earth as what withdraws from all will-to-power, the transition from the will-to-dominate to an openness for the open. This essay, in my opinion, makes this entire collection worth the price. This is essential thinking in a time of need.

The essay from Malpas, "Nihilism and the Thinking of Place," attempts to characterize nihilism as an error in the thinking of place. Not only that, but it is also with regard to place that a possible antidote to nihilism might be offered. Malpas sets the stage for his analysis through an appeal to the Kehre in thinking that Heidegger attributes to the truth of being. If all other questions are grounded in or reducible to such a turning, then, according to Malpas,

The question of place may thus be said to be all that Heidegger's thought addresses -- not in the sense that this is only what is at issue, but in the sense that this question encompasses every other question, and is that to which every other question must be brought back (p. 112).

This is indeed an appealing position, and Malpas argues the position in a manner that is both convincing and faithful to Heidegger. However, the position is at the same time troubling, and for a number of reasons. First, the argument could equally be made for a number of other Heideggerian tropes. To name only one, the same could be said of language inasmuch as it is language that makes way for place. More specifically, in both "The Essence of Language" and "The Way to Language," place is made space for (if it may be put that way) by the Be-wëgung of language, the way-making movement of language in Krell’s translation.[2] Second, as much as it is appealing for our more philosophically trained eyes to want to seek out first grounds, and as much as Heidegger seemingly satisfies that appeal, there is also the sense in which Heidegger resists that appeal, a resistance that has found its way into a great deal of thought that has found inspiration in Heidegger. This is first made evident in Heidegger himself in the equiprimordial (gleichursprünglich) nature of the constituent elements of the constitution of the being of the Da in Being and Time.

Aside from Heidegger, there have been those after Heidegger with an ear and eye turned towards difference, such as Derrida and Foucault, even while at the same time worrying about the gathering of the many into one (especially Derrida). For all of that, Malpas provides an abundance of both familiar assertions regarding Heidegger's thought and novel insights through the lens of place. Both of these are on display in his discussion of the Heideggerian treatment of Cartesian metaphysics. Malpas there cogently shows how Heidegger's analysis of Descartes accounts for both realism and idealism, the manner in which both belong to nihilism, and the need for continued work on what Heidegger thinks as the fourfold as what might come after. Further, as much as Malpas' contribution incites us to once again return to Heidegger, he also leaves us anticipating where his thinking of place will lead us.

Of the remaining five essays, it is my opinion that only the essay by Sinclair is worth recommending. In his essay, Sinclair puts Heidegger into conversation with Jacques Ellul. Aside from what is generally a faithful and insightful reading of Heidegger on technology, Sinclair not only writes convincingly of a possible rapprochement between Heidegger and Ellul, but he makes one want to read Ellul, for the first time in my case, but perhaps again for many others.

All in all, I would recommend this collection of essays, not so much for its treatment of nihilism "after" Heidegger, but for a number of strategies for where to begin a thinking of nihilism from out of the Nietzschean/Heideggerian context. Although this context may speak to many concerns, one of the more interesting is the direction towards which the collection is directed, which is a re-thinking of the political. It might well be that Heidegger, perhaps best known for his indefensible political action, will still yet offer some future for the philosophical thinking of the political.

[1] Martin Heidegger, Die Geschichte des Seyns, Gesamtausgabe 69, ed. Peter Trawny.

[2] See Krell's translation of "Der Weg zur Sprache" in Basic Writings, 2nd revised and expanded edition (New York: HarperCollins, 1993), pp. 393-426.