The Mystical in Wittgenstein's Early Writings

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James R. Atkinson, The Mystical in Wittgenstein's Early Writings, Routledge, 2009, 145pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415963442.

Reviewed by Russell Nieli, Princeton University



Ludwig Wittgenstein published just one book during his lifetime, the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus,1 which was completed in the summer of 1918, and first appeared in a published form three years later. The book was written during the war years 1914-1918, a period of great spiritual and existential turmoil in Wittgenstein’s personal life, indications of which can be clearly discerned in parts of the written text.

We possess an extraordinary letter from Bertrand Russell to Lady Ottoline Morell that was written in the winter of 1919 after Russell had met with Wittgenstein in Holland to discuss his Tractatus manuscript. The letter is an invaluable resource for our understanding of Wittgenstein’s essentially religio-spiritual personality and his general frame of mind during, and shortly before, the First World War, when he was developing his basic Tractarian ideas. Here is what Russell wrote at this time:

I have much to tell you that is of interest. I leave here today [December 20, 1919, from the The Hague] after a fortnight’s stay, during a week of which Wittgenstein was here, and we discussed his book [the Tractatus] everyday. I came to think even better of it than I had done; I feel sure it is really a great book, though I do not feel sure it is right… . I had felt in his book a flavour of mysticism, but was astonished when I found that he has become a complete mystic. He reads people like Kierkegaard and Angelus Silesius, and he seriously contemplates becoming a monk. It all started from William James’s Varieties of Religious Experience, and grew (not unnaturally) during the winter he spent alone in Norway before the war, when he was nearly mad. Then during the war a curious thing happened. He went on duty to the town of Tarnov in Galicia, and happened to come upon a bookshop, which, however, seemed to contain nothing but picture postcards. However, he went inside and found that it contained just one book: Tolstoy on the Gospels. He brought it merely because there was no other. He read it and re-read it, and thenceforth had it always with him, under fire and at all times. But on the whole he likes Tolstoy less than Dostoyevsky (especially Karamazov). He has penetrated deep into mystical ways of thought and feeling, but I think (though he wouldn’t agree) that what he likes best in mysticism is its power to make him stop thinking. I don’t much think he will really become a monk — it is an idea, not an intention. His intention is to be a teacher. He gave all his money to his brothers and sisters, because he found earthly possessions a burden. I wish you had seen him.2

Russell describes here a truly extraordinary personality, a God-obsessed and God-haunted man, who, as his Russian teacher Fania Pascal would remark years later, was “a person above all in search of spiritual salvation.”3 Wittgenstein’s thoughts on becoming a contemplative monk were more serious than Russell supposes, for in 1926, the year he decided to leave rural school teaching, Wittgenstein actually inquired at a Benedictine monastery in Austria about the possibility of joining a monastic order but he was discouraged by the Father Superior. Throughout much of his adult life Wittgenstein seems to have been enamored by the figure of Father Zosima, the all-wise monk in Dostoyevsky’s The Brothers Karamazov, and could quote long passages from the speeches of Zosima by heart.

Wittgenstein, however, usually kept his religious and spiritual cards close to his chest. Although he once described St. Augustine’s Confessions as possibly “the most serious book ever written,”4 Wittgenstein was not, as Augustine was, given to public confessions of his religious convictions and shared his beliefs in such matters only with tiny numbers of appropriately close friends, the most important of whom was the architect Paul Engelmann. This was in tune with his general belief at the time he wrote the Tractatus that the religious convictions of most people in the West suffered from over-verbalization and that in the realm of “higher things” language was a poor medium for expressing truth. In the presence of what is sacred and ineffable, Wittgenstein believed, we usually do best by retaining a pious silence. As the Christian spiritualist Angelus Silesius once put it, “God is so much above all that one can say nothing. You worship him better therefore through silence.” This was essentially Wittgenstein’s view and a central theme of his Tractatus.

An important exception to this preference for silence, however, is a lecture Wittgenstein gave to a Cambridge student group soon after his return to university life in 1929. This “Lecture on Ethics”5 (as it is usually called) is an enormously important document for understanding the background in religious experience that conditioned much of Wittgenstein’s thoughts during the period of his early philosophy, and is indispensable for interpreting some of the more mysterious, mystical, and metaphysical-sounding passages in both his Tractatus and the Notebooks6 he kept during the First World War from which many Tractatus passages are drawn.

It is in this lecture — the only public lecture not part of his university courses or obligations that Wittgenstein is ever known to have given in his lifetime — that Wittgenstein described certain experiences that for him personally constitute “absolute value” rather than merely relative or instrumental value, that give insight into “the meaning of life,” and that suggest “what makes life worth living.” One of these experiences Wittgenstein speaks of is the experience of being "absolutely safe," of being “safe in the hands of God.” A second he describes as “seeing the world as a miracle,” or “[wondering] at the existence of the world,” or seeing the world as God’s creation and with such wonderment and astonishment that one is prompted to say “how extraordinary that the world should exist.”

In my own published work on Wittgenstein, I have devoted a great deal of effort to analyzing both of these classes of experiences and showing their relevance for interpreting many of the more cryptic references in both the Tractatus and Notebooks to mystical, spiritual, and illuminist themes.7 The first type of experience I called Ecstatic Mystic Experience, the second Creation Mystic Experience. The Ecstatic Mystic Experience — the experience of “standing outside” the world and all that happens in the world and thus being immune to all its dangers and corruptions — is clearly the more radical, more mind-bending, and more rare of the two experiences, and according to Wittgenstein’s biographer Ray Monk was considered by Wittgenstein throughout his life to be “paradigmatic of religious experience.”8

Much of the commentary on Wittgenstein’s Tractatus since its publication has focused on the book’s technical system of logic and language with little concern for its overarching moral and spiritual thematic. Despite valiant efforts by a few writers in the 1970s and 1980s to alter this situation, not much has changed in recent times. Comparatively little has been written on the parts of Wittgenstein’s early philosophy that deal with “the mystical,” “eternity,” “the meaning of life,” “timelessness,” “God,” “ethics,” and similar spiritual themes that come up in both the Tractatus and Notebooks. When they are written about by philosophers whose academic training and experience is narrowly confined to the British analytic tradition, they usually suffer from an obtuseness and lack of feeling for their subject matter that makes their commentary of little value.9

In view of this it was with great eagerness that I began James R. Atkinson’s recently published The Mystical in Wittgenstein’s Early Philosophy. With a whole book dedicated to a theme so important to understanding Wittgenstein’s early writing — a theme I labored to bring to the forefront of the philosophic world more than twenty years ago without discernable success — Atkinson’s work was approached with great hope that the noumenal and the mystical in the early Wittgenstein would at last be getting their due. Alas, Atkinson’s book is a great disappointment. While the book has a number of strengths, Atkinson, in my view, simply doesn’t understand the kind of higher level ecstatic experiences that lie at the heart of Wittgenstein’s Tractarian project, and has little empathy for what Wittgenstein is trying to accomplish when he says that God and the meaning of the world “must lie outside the world.”

But let’s start with the book’s strengths. Unlike the early logical positivist interpreters of the Tractatus, Atkinson recognizes that Wittgenstein in his early philosophy was no enemy of “higher things.” While Wittgenstein believed that the expressive capacity of language was largely confined to descriptive statements such as those found in the natural sciences, Wittgenstein also believed, Atkinson stresses, that there were certain ineffable truths about what is real that had to be passed over in silence yet were not for this reason unimportant or insignificant for human life. Indeed, what we must pass over in silence may be just as important — or much more important — for the early Wittgenstein, Atkinson shows, than what can be expressed through language. Among the things relegated by Wittgenstein to the realm of silence are God, the mystical, eternity, the wonder at the world’s sheer existence, one’s higher or true inner-self, and the meaning of life. Each of these topics and themes are given their proper due by Atkinson, who does not neglect the more frequently discussed logical system of the Tractatus seen as a development out of the earlier philosophy of Bertrand Russell.

Atkinson places his greatest stress on the statement in the Tractatus, "It is not how the world is that is mystical, but that it is" (Tr. 6.44). This is indeed a key passage where Wittgenstein is clearly referring to what he describes in the “Lecture on Ethics” as the experience of wonderment at the world’s sheer existence, of “seeing the world as a miracle” — an experience that Wittgenstein held to be the quintessential ethical experience. In commenting on this passage Norman Malcolm, who was a student of Wittgenstein’s in the 1940s, says that a "certain feeling of amazement that anything should exist at all, was something experienced by Wittgenstein, not only during the Tractatus period, but also when I knew him."10 Atkinson is clearly correct to see this passage as of central importance for understanding Wittgenstein’s conception of the mystical, and particularly what we might call his understanding of the creation-mystical or mystically immanent.

Nevertheless Atkinson fails to see — and it is the central failing of his book — that the creation-mystical and mystically immanent is interwoven in Wittgenstein’s Tractatus with a transcendentally mystical or mystic-ecstatic thematic that corresponds with what Wittgenstein considered throughout his life to be the quintessentially religious experience, namely, the ecstatic or rapturous experience of feeling “absolutely safe” beyond the changing world in the hands of a transcendent God. Atkinson acknowledges that there are important passages in the Tractatus that could be interpreted — and have often been interpreted — in the ecstatic sense to suggest that Wittgenstein believed in a two-realm or two-world theory, with language descriptive of events in the one, while the other exists beyond or outside of language and for this reason is ineffable. Such passages, he recognizes, include the following:

The sense of the world must lie outside the world. In the world everything is as it is, and everything happens as it does happen: in it no value exists — and if it did exist, it would have no value. If there is any value that does have value, it must lie outside the whole sphere of what happens and is the case… . It must lie outside the world. (Tr. 6:41)

The solution of the riddle of life in space and time lies outside space and time. (It is certainly not the solution of any problems of natural science that is required). (Tr. 6.4313)

How things are in the world is a matter of complete indifference for what is higher. God does not reveal himself in the world. (Tr. 6.432)

Atkinson rejects the two-world or two-realm view of Wittgenstein’s early philosophy — or what he calls the “metaphysical interpretation” — for reasons that are poorly stated but generally boil down to the conviction that only the immanental variety of mysticism is present in the Tractatus and Notebooks, and that what might seem like a belief in a transcendental-ecstatic “outside” of the world is really just Wittgenstein’s way of stating in another manner the truth of his claim that it is not how the world is, but that it is, that is mystical. Atkinson’s defense of this view is quirky and will convince no one who both reads the relevant text of the Tractatus and Notebooks together with Wittgenstein’s direct account of his own personal religious experiences in the “Lecture on Ethics.”

Despite the fact that Atkinson has attempted to write a whole book on The Mystical in the Early Wittgenstein, he doesn’t seem to be interested at all in understanding mystic experience in general, or Wittgenstein’s mystical experiences more particularly. Incredibly, Atkinson doesn’t seem even to have read Wittgenstein’s “Lecture on Ethics,” though he is clearly aware of the work since he criticizes an essay by Norman Malcolm on "The Mysticism of the Tractatus," in which Wittgenstein’s personal testimony in the “Lecture” prominently appears. In criticizing Malcolm’s essay, Atkinson says, “the evidence for or against the claim that Wittgenstein had mystical experiences has biographical interest” — but such biographical facts, he believes, are not relevant to viewing Wittgenstein’s published writings or to interpreting the Tractatus! It seems only the narrowest of analytic philosophers could hold such a view. Evidence for mystical experiences in Wittgenstein’s life, Atkinson says, "holds no more weight in this discussion [of Wittgenstein’s writing] than to say that the author of this work [i.e., Atkinson’s The Mystical in the Early Wittgenstein] has had a mystical experience" (p. 111).

But Atkinson is wrong here on both points. The reason we find people like Rudolf Otto and Evelyn Underhill to be such great expositors of Christian mystical and spiritual writings is because they (a) have a good grounding in the texts and the original languages used by the religious figures they study, and (b) they have an inner empathy and understanding for the types of spiritual experiences and altered states of consciousness to which the texts allude. (Otto himself is most explicit in seeing at least some minimal level of empathy as a sine qua non for understanding the mystical and other religious experiences of the Christian religious figures he studies.11)

What is said of Otto and Underhill here vis-à-vis Christian spiritual writers has equal validity for the best interpreters of spiritual and mystical writers in other traditions — a group that would include Heinrich Zimmer (Hinduism), Seyyed Hossein Nasr (Sufism), Rufus Jones (Quakerism), Gershom Scholem (Jewish mysticism), Hans Jonas (ancient Gnosticism), Mircea Eliade (Shamanism), and D.T. Suzuki (Zen Buddhism). While the expositor need not have attained the same level of depth and illumination as the spiritualist writers he seeks to explore, and he surely need not give us personal autobiographical or confessional material, any large experiential gap between expositor and the figures that he seeks to expound will guarantee superficiality and misunderstanding in his interpretation. This is the main reason for the misunderstanding of Wittgenstein’s Tractatus by most of its early interpreters — the outstanding exception being Paul Engelmann, Wittgenstein’s wartime spiritual soul-mate — and why James Atkinson never really grasps the experiential core of the early Wittgenstein or the central ecstatic elements in his Tractarian philosophy. Atkinson, it seems, simply cannot relate, existentially or experientially, to some of the experiences Wittgenstein describes in his “Lecture on Ethics” (which is probably why he avoids any discussion of them in his book).

Atkinson compounds his difficulties by not only showing a lack of interest in the testimony of Wittgenstein himself about his religious experiences, but by an equal lack of interest in the writers on mysticism and spirituality who we know to have greatly influenced Wittgenstein’s thinking on these matters. Surely no competent interpreter would write a book on the mystical in the early Wittgenstein without thoroughly reading both William James’s Varieties of Religious Experience and Tolstoy’s The Gospel in Brief, since both books are known to have influenced Wittgenstein profoundly at the time he was conceiving his Tractarian ideas, and he continued to recommend these books to friends for many years. The Gospel in Brief is of special importance because Wittgenstein’s reflections in the Tractatus and Notebooks on timelessness, eternity, and living in the present have clearly been influenced by formulations in chapters 7-10 of Tolstoy’s work.12 Yet Atkinson never seems to have read either of these books — or many other books that might have aided in understanding the mind of someone who has “penetrated deep into mystical ways of thought and feeling.”

Atkinson at one point tries to defend his non-involvement with other mystic writers, even those who clearly influenced Wittgenstein, by saying that he has “not drawn upon the writings of mystics to support the claims contained” in his book because "to draw comparisons or contrasts between the contents of the Tractatus and those of other similar writings is scholarship" — and he is not interested in scholarship, only exegesis (p. 118). Nevertheless surely sound exegesis usually goes hand in hand with sound scholarship, and to try to understand Wittgenstein’s musings on the mystical and related themes without understanding James, Tolstoy, or Father Zosima is like trying to understand the Alexandrian Fathers without understanding neo-Platonism, or Marx without understanding Hegel, French Socialism, and Ricardian economics. (Curiously, Atkinson doesn’t apply his strictures against “compare-and-contrast” scholarship to Bertrand Russell’s writings. The first two chapters of his book, in fact, are largely an attempt to show how Wittgenstein developed some of his logical theories against the backdrop of Russell’s “logical atomism.”)

At one point Atkinson breaks his own rule of “not drawing upon the writings of mystics to support the claims contained” in his book, and finds a comparison between the Tractatus and the “negative theology” of the Pseudo-Dionysius very helpful in understanding the “negative metaphysics” of Wittgenstein. He writes:

In Chapter 5 of [the] Mystical Theology Pseudo-Dionysius states, in a passage similar to Wittgenstein’s, that the Supreme or Pre-eminent Cause of all that one perceives is not any one thing… . Rather than stating what he believes are the attributes of the Supreme Cause, Pseudo-Dionysius offers a list of negations of ‘what cannot be spoken or grasped by understanding’ … The first purpose for drawing a comparison between Pseudo-Dionysius and Wittgenstein is to show precedence for applying a method of doubt or negation to a mystical end that lies outside time and what can be said. The second and more important purpose for drawing a comparison between these two philosophers is that Pseudo-Dionysius defines the problem that lies at the heart of the tension between the mystical and language. The mystical, according to Pseudo-Dionysius, can only be known in its absence, because it cannot be expressed in language. (p. 124)

Here is revealed both the truth and untruth of Atkinson’s Wittgenstein interpretation. While it is undoubtedly true that the Pseudo-Dionysius, like Wittgenstein, believed that what is beheld in higher levels of mystic transport cannot be expressed in language, at the same time the Pseudo-Dionysius also believed — again like Wittgenstein but this time contrary to Atkinson’s understanding of Wittgenstein — that higher level mystic-ecstatic experiences are not experiences of absences but of overpowering encounters with a Higher Presence. Further, this Higher Presence is made manifest in a rapturous-ecstatic experience that carries the experiencer beyond the realm of normal reality and beyond the capacity of speech to express.

This is paralleled in Wittgenstein’s “Lecture on Ethics” when Wittgenstein distinguishes a “natural” and a “supernatural” order, and makes clear his belief that the foundations of both ethics and religion are supernatural, not natural, and that the ethical and religious are contained in a divine-transcendent Beyond of all inner-worldly content and structure. The experiential foundations of ethics and religion, Wittgenstein suggests in the “Lecture,” involve “what is intrinsically sublime and above all other subject matters.” He goes on to explain:

[But] our words used as we use them in science, are vessels capable only of containing and conveying meaning and sense, natural meaning and sense. Ethics, if it is anything, is supernatural and our words will only express facts, as a teacup will only hold a teacup full of water [even] if I were to pour out a gallon over it… . I can only describe my feelings by the metaphor, that, if a man could write a book on ethics which really was a book on ethics, this book would, with an explosion, destroy all the other books in the world. (LE, p. 7)

Wittgenstein has tried to capture here something of the overpowering majesty and sublimity of the kinds of noumenal experiences he alludes to in the “Lecture” — a majesty and sublimity that is not an absence but a Presence so overpowering and mind-boggling that language cannot contain it (just as a teacup cannot contain a deluge of water poured over it). There is also the sense in Wittgenstein’s “Lecture” that even to try to describe the experiences that confer “absolute ethical value” may border on hubris or profanation since piety demands of man an appropriately silent humility in the presence of what is intrinsically sacred and sublime.

Like Wittgenstein, the Pseudo-Dionysius clearly has a dual order or two-realm understanding of God and the world (though his reality-picture is much richer and more multi-layered than Wittgenstein’s), and he leaves no uncertainty that this is a truth contained in the mystic rapture itself. In earlier chapters of the Mystic Theology this mysterious, unknown Syrian monk writes the following:

Let this be my prayer; but do thou, dear Timothy, in the diligent exercise of mystical contemplation, leave behind the senses and the operations of the intellect … and all things in the world of being and non-being … The higher we soar in contemplation the more limited become our expressions of that which is purely intelligible … We pass not merely into brevity of speech, but even into absolute silence, of thoughts as well as of words… . We mount upwards from below to that which is the highest, and according to the degree of transcendence, our speech is restrained until, the entire ascent being accomplished, we become wholly voiceless, in as much as we are absorbed in Him who is totally ineffable.13

This would be a fitting epigraph to Wittgenstein’s Tractatus. More than 85 years after its publication, it remains the most misunderstood major philosophical work of the 20th century. It remains misunderstood largely because of interpreters’ failure to appreciate the importance of the mystical and the ecstatic as they are interwoven into the text. Regrettably, James Atkinson’s recent book has done little to change this situation.

1 Ludwig Wittgenstein, Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, translated by D.F. Pears and B.F. McGuinness, Humanities Press, New York, 1961.

2 Letters to Russell, Keynes, and Moore, edited by G.H. von Wright, Cornell University Press, Ithaca, New York, 1974, p. 82.

3 Fania Pascal, “Wittgenstein: A Personal Memoir,” in Rush Rhees, editor, Recollections of Wittgenstein, Oxford University Press, New York, 1984, p. 44n.

4 The source here is Wittgenstein’s student and friend Maurice O’C. Drury, “Some Notes on Conversations with Wittgenstein,” in Rush Rhees, Ibid., p. 90.

5 Ludwig Wittgenstein, “Wittgenstein’s Lecture on Ethics,” Philosophical Review, 74(1965):3-12.

6 Ludwig Wittgenstein, Notebooks 1914-1916, edited by G.H. von Wright and G.E.M. Anscombe, with English translation by G.E.M. Anscombe, Harper and Row, New York, 1961.

7 Russell Nieli, Wittgenstein: From Mysticism to Ordinary Language, State University of New York Press, Albany, New York, 1987; “Mysticism, Morality, and the Wittgenstein Problem,” Archiv für Religionsgeschichte, 9(2007):83-141.

8 Ray Monk, Ludwig Wittgenstein: The Duty of Genius, The Free Press, New York, 1990, p. 51.

9 One might recall in this context Nietzsche’s remark in Ecce Homo: “In the end, nobody hears more out of things, including books, than he knows already. For that to which one lacks access from experience, one has no ears.” In Walter Kaufmann, editor, Existentialism from Dostoevsky to Sartre, Meridian Books, New York, 1956, p. 111.

10 Norman Malcolm, Ludwig Wittgenstein: A Memoir, Oxford University Press, London, 1977, p. 70.

11 Rudolf Otto, The Idea of the Holy, Oxford University Press, Oxford, 1950.

12 Leo Tolstoy, The Gospel in Brief, edited by F.A. Flowers, III, translated by Isabel Hapgood, University of Nebraska Press, Lincoln, 1997.

13 Pseudo-Dionysius, Theologia Mystica, chapter I, chapter III, Shrine of Wisdom translation, Fintry, Brook, England, 1923.