The Mysticism of Saint Augustine: Rereading the Confessions

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John Peter Kenney, The Mysticism of Saint Augustine: Rereading the Confessions, Routledge, 2005, 160pp., $33.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415288339.

Reviewed by James Wetzel, Villanova University


Augustine is a father-figure in the genealogy of Western mysticism, but if John Peter Kenney is right, the modern conception of the mystical does scant justice to Augustine's genius and is very likely to cause us to neglect or distort his real offering to the mystical tradition: a new form of contemplative philosophy. Kenney's concise and well-conceived argument, which should be of broad interest to anyone versed in the philosophy of religion, has particular relevance for two groups of readers. For those of us who have been following debates over the epistemology of religious experience, Kenney's Augustine is an inducement to abandon the analogy between sense-perception and religious experience and allow a much greater theological scope to the notion of an experiential report. For others of us who are more interested in Augustine himself, we are encouraged not to read Augustine's foil in matters mystical, Plotinus, as a technician of tiny ecstasies. If Plotinus was a contemplative truth-seeker and not a man obsessed with having as many experiences as possible of ineffable bliss, then Augustine, as a serious reader of Plotinus, may not have been very preoccupied with the issue of whether tiny ecstasies can be multiplied and prolonged in this mortal life. Kenney, who is both kinds of reader, urges us to read Augustine's most innovative work, the Confessions, first and foremost as a contemplative text and only then as a source of mystical illumination. The result will be, hopefully, a transformed and much improved conception of mysticism.

For most readers of the Confessions, and Kenney is no exception here, there are three separate cases of extraordinary religious apprehension described in the text. The first comes in book VII, where Augustine recounts heeding a Platonic directive to turn within and finding himself carried off to a "place of unlikeness" (regio dissimilitudinis), where he gets his first palpable experience of immaterial beauty. The second comes in book VIII, where he recalls his self-torment over his ineffectual will to abandon secular, especially sexual, pleasures and live an ascetically Christian life. In the midst of all that torment, he hears a voice calling to him to "take up and read" (tolle, lege). Excitedly he finds his book -- a collection of Pauline texts -- and alights upon an injunction to "wear the flesh of Christ" (Rom. 13:13-14). Immediately he feels his heart filled and secured by divine light. The third and last apprehension is one that Augustine and his mother undergo together while they are waiting at the port city of Ostia for transit back to Africa. She is, unknown to him at the time, days from her death. The two of them look out upon a garden from a window berth and start to converse about the life to come. Gently they are drawn into a wordless hearing of divine logos and given a supersensible taste of the root wisdom of creation.

The most famous of the three episodes -- the tolle, lege experience -- is badly book-ended by the other two, or at least it is if we are bent on thinking of extraordinary religious apprehension on the model of supersensible sensation. Kenney credits William James with having made this model so seductive to modern theorists. In the mysticism chapters of The Varieties of Religious Experience, James definitively associates mysticism with mystical experience and offers four defining criteria for the requisite experience: it is knowledge-conveying, rightly authoritative for the person experiencing it, short-lived, and passively received. Probably what is most important about mystical experience thus construed is that it sustains an experiential gulf between haves and have-nots; either one has the experience and so knows what it conveys or one is hopelessly in the dark. This model, which admits of great refinement (I think of William Alston on the logic of perceptual experience), risks making the experience of the divine akin to getting a first taste of ice cream or, dare I say it, having an orgasm, but being a supersensible matter, the experience of the divine bears a logical, not a qualitative, analogy to ordinary sense experience. In other words, to experience the divine is, on this model of mysticism, to be transported to a world apart from the ordinary, a place of unlikeness.

If we apply the Jamesian model of mysticism to Augustine, then book VII will be read to contain his somewhat overwrought description of having been granted a brief stay in a place of unlikeness. In book IX, he has another supersensible experience (one is apparently much like another), albeit this time in the company of his unlettered mother. There is no allusion in the Ostia episode to a philosophical tradition of spiritual expertise and intellectual adeptness. Monica's presence in Augustine's rapture is the sign of a humbler, more chastened Augustine. For those who have worried about the authenticity of Augustine's conversion in late 386 to Christianity, and there have been many such worriers in 20th century Augustine scholarship, the issue comes down to whether Augustine is, at the time of his so-called conversion (the tolle-lege episode), more the student of a pagan luminary or more the son of his unadornedly pious mother. If more the student of Plotinus, then he has confused Christian redemption with ascetic self-refinement; if more the son of Monica, then he knows something about grace and the condescension of divine love.

The issue of Augustine's conversion, of its authority or lack thereof, has proved both alluring and intractable. The great student of late-antique culture and literature, Pierre Courcelle, tried to lay the issue to rest when he argued mid-century that Platonism and Christianity were far from antithetical and that Augustine had in fact found in the Milanese Bishop, Ambrose (a less problematic father-figure for him than Plotinus), the model of a saintly Christian Platonist. Augustine could, in short, be both a Platonist and his mother's son. Nearly every scholar of Augustine since Courcelle has bowed to Courcelle's argument, but bowing is a far cry from knowing how a Christian Platonism is really conceivable. What does it mean, if anything, to wed a reverence for the inalienable humanity of God to a Platonic interest in supersensible experience?

I have learned from Kenney that this is a bad way to pose the question. Interest in supersensible experience is not especially characteristic of ancient Platonism; it savors more of a modern fascination for the feel of an experience and its promise of an altered state of awareness. Once Plotinus is abstracted from his ancient context and made out to be a Jamesian mystic, the terms of Augustine's engagement with Plotinus get severely limited. Has Augustine experienced Plotinian ecstasy or hasn't he? If he hasn't, then he and Plotinus have nothing to say to one another. If he has, then he and Plotinus somehow know (paradoxically) the same sublime aloneness and have no need to share words. Augustine may be apt, unlike Plotinus, to thank Jesus for his momentary recesses from the business of this world (James called such recesses "moral holidays"), but that is a difference that concerns the cause of an experience, not its noetic core. Mystical ecstasy, however caused, is on this model always the experience of another world, whether metaphysical or a world to come. There is, in fact, no way to mark a difference here between the perspective of a disembodied soul and the experience of the Christian end of days. All difference gets relegated to context and the world that gets transcended.

Kenney spends the first third of his tripartite study of Augustinian mysticism on the contemplative philosophy of the Enneads, hoping to deliver us the Plotinus with whom Augustine can truly engage. This is well traveled territory for Kenney, who is a leading scholar of late-antique monotheism and its mystical resonances. He reads Plotinus as a monotheist, not a monist. The embodied soul that ascends in contemplation to its undescended self, eternal and untouched by flesh, is still never quite one with the One. It is crucial to Kenney's argument that we not confuse the complex and somewhat ambivalent monotheism of Plotinus with a failed monism. Plotinus is properly struggling with the mystery of the soul's individuation, here the problem of distinctiveness within a presumptive unity.

When Kenney shifts his attention in part two to Augustine's engagement with Plotinus, he retains in his interpretation two large pieces of the conventional scholarly wisdom on the topic: one is the assumption that Plotinus teaches Augustine how to think about a disembodied God, or, better, about a God who is essentially not a body; the other is that Augustine quickly becomes disillusioned with Plotinian theĊria, finding it fine as knowledge but wanting as therapy. It is the second assumption that has fed all the empty scholarly speculation about what Augustine's Christianity adds to or subtracts from his Platonism, and I am frankly surprised that Kenney buys into it. Indeed it is Kenney himself who shows us most clearly the falsity of the assumption. If we take his cue and read the Confessions as "a record of a momentous confluence in late antique culture between Christian and pagan monotheism" (p. 55), it is easy to see that Plotinian and Augustinian monotheism are theoretically different. Based on Plotinian theory, the contemplative soul ascends to discover its similarity to its divine source; based on Augustinian theory, this same soul confronts its otherness to God -- an otherness that can be both good and bad. Augustine's contemplative theology, much more so than that of Plotinus, is a theology of difference and a sustained attempt not to confuse sin with finitude.

The more cardinal assumption of the scholarship -- that Plotinus is the source of Augustine's concept of transcendence -- also fits ill with Kenney's strikingly original rereading of the Confessions. Since Augustine is clearly not committed to the idea that embodiment is fundamentally a pathological condition of soul, he is free to think of the body as a principle of individuation. God differs from the soul in being its creator (a notoriously difficult basis for soul-individuation), but also because God is one particular person, Jesus of Nazareth, and not another (we'll have to see how that one works out). It is no longer so clear, thanks to Kenney, that Augustine has unequivocally embraced a God who is essentially not a body. It is not that Augustine still harbors some lingering attachment to Manichean materialism; the point is more that his incarnational theology is inescapably a part of his theology of creation (his monotheism). If we allow that point its play, then it makes sense to pair the ascent to God in book VII with the descent to the flesh in book VIII; the two are aspects of a single contemplation. It also becomes evident what makes the vision at Ostia in book IX so singular and important: the conjunction of seeing God and being aware of the presence of another person.

In the third and final part of his study, Kenney extends his consideration of Augustine's contemplative theology beyond the Confessions and concludes with some speculation about the loss of contemplative philosophy in our own time -- a loss having something to do with the seduction of a modern mysticism. Kenney, it seems to me, does a spectacular job of showing us how mystical experience is at best a dubious analytical category when applied to a contemplative tradition. He is less helpful if we want to know why that category has had its ascendancy in modern times or what an alternatively modern but still contemplative notion of the mystical would look like. I don't advance either of those limitations as criticisms of his project. It would take at least another book to sort out why experiential knowledge became, in the context of modern religion, the experience of knowledge. As for wanting a contemplative notion of the mystical and some release from modern experience-mongering, that will require much patient work on the path that Kenney has already staked out for us: a new history of monotheism.