The Naked Self: Kierkegaard and Personal Identity

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Patrick Stokes, The Naked Self: Kierkegaard and Personal Identity, Oxford University Press, 2015, 256pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198732730.

Reviewed by Alastair Hannay, University of Oslo


Confronted with the radical changes any human being undergoes between infancy and dotage we can see the point in separating the personage from the self that we reckon on having been there all along. The former is what figures in biographies (and obituaries), the more elusive self-same self being reserved for its own point of view — as when we assume first memories revive experiences of a self that we still are. Of The Naked Self its author says that “central to [its] entire trajectory” is the distinction between “our phenomenal sense of self and our reflective awareness of being a particular person” (p. 22). Note that it is the self’s own sense of being that particular person that is distinguished from whatever self has that sense. Put the emphasis on “particular” and the reference to Kierkegaard slips into place.

We need more if we are not facing another volume in an already voluminous series of studies devoted to unraveling that thinker’s multi-faceted thought. That extra is summarized in the book’s final paragraph. It refers to a “metaphysical thicket” from which Kierkegaard, though “perhaps to the surprise of some,” can show us a way out (p. 231). Allowing that the problems posed by current thinkers are not those with which Kierkegaard was concerned, Patrick Stokes has by then done much to show us that in Kierkegaard there are “philosophical resources which we can use in trying to answer some of the questions . . . living philosophers have raised” (p. 18). He has also pointed to those special gifts of psychological observation that enabled Kierkegaard to put his first-person perspective on personal identity into “the present tense,” and in a way that accommodates the “idea of omnipresent concern for the final status of one’s life” (p. 19). Any theism that may appear attached to this idea is not necessarily a limitation for “there need be no actual accounting for that status.” When it comes to eschatology (the last things) we can “depart from Kierkegaard’s core assumptions” and “make his thought more widely acceptable” (p. 19). Acceptance today can come more easily due to an “increasing emphasis on the first-person perspective” (p. 216) in current discussion.

The “language of nudity” employed in the title occurs rarely in Kierkegaard. Stokes traces its few occurrences from 1835, Kierkegaard then still a student, to the year of The Sickness unto Death (1849). That might seem a thin basis. But the eclecticism it implies (and encourages) can have advantages. It allows a wide range of relevant debate outside the Kierkegaard circle to find points of contact in his work and vice versa. A brief section in chapter 7 on “Minimal vs. Narrative Selves” (pp. 180-186) brings in neuro- as well as cognitive science, the former with Antonio Damasio’s (though originally William James’) talk of momentary “pulses” of consciousness, and the latter with Daniel Dennett, cited as a non-realist “narrativism” in which selfhood is a fiction (see p. 7) devised by a semantically productive brain. Casting widely in this way also allows Stokes to bring into view pervasive themes that recur in name only briefly and in varied contexts. If there can be a disadvantage, it is a danger of losing sight of these contexts.

Since Kierkegaard’s own references to a naked self are only “occasional and oblique” (p. 117), they can help to illustrate and evaluate this point. One occurrence is in a passage from Either/Or where Judge William comments on people who “in a religious sense teach . . . that one becomes a normal human being by going stark naked, which can be done by taking off one’s entire concretion” (p. 183). ‘Concretion’ may be read here as the intractable but contingent background in which a life has to be led and which Heidegger called “facticity.” On a theistic reading of Judge William, however, it can refer to the lot bestowed by God on each human being. Acquiring selfhood will then be accepting that lot and using it as best one can to express the divine. Judge William’s own preferred expression is an ethical life of civic virtue, although Fear and Trembling begins shortly afterwards to upset the idea that the ethical (as “the universal”) is “as such” the divine.1 The actual context of Judge William’s remark is a presentation of the aesthete as someone picking and choosing among his lot as to what to count as “eternal.” It only remains so, however, for as long as it suits his life-view; the aesthete lacks a diachronic self-sustaining “core.” Stokes (although arguing against the very possibility) suggests the aesthete might be diagnosed as a Strawsonian “Episodic”: "a mere “succession of countless selves of only momentary duration” (p. 94). On the theistic reading it is not, however, absence of a core that deprives the aesthete of selfhood; it is his forgoing his only hope of a “history” of active willingness to express the divine. If the suspected deficiency of Judge William’s kind of history is then also taken into account (for reasons made explicit in Concluding Unscientific Postscript), it begins to look as though any attempt to “situate” (p. 23) Kierkegaard uniquely through the settled coordinates of current thinking is to aim with fixed elevation at a steadily ascending target.

Perhaps there is more Hegel in Kierkegaard than Anglophone commentators would care to admit. But it is worth bearing in mind that it was by working his own way out of another metaphysical thicket that Kierkegaard found a place for both his ethics and an application for his psychological insights. Where the post-Kantians had expanded Kant’s notion of an active consciousness to the extent of identifying the self-conscious soul’s fulfillment with the completion of God’s creation, Kierkegaard reconceived the task of completion as that of reshaping the individual will in a world as given. It was by replacing Hegel’s inherent pantheism with a personal God (helped by his reading of the younger Fichte on the “personality” of God) that Kierkegaard found a place for the ethics that he found Hegel had “ignored.”2

Nothing in Stokes’ book suggests that he need disagree with this. In fact his whole project depends on “tracing a different understanding” as he says regarding the key concept of “contemporaneity” (p. 21). It does however raise the question whether the helpful Kierkegaard will turn out to be a specious Kierkegaard. But then again, we might ask why should that matter? As long as we are clear about which Kierkegaard is helping the discussion along, the one can be as good as the other.

This is, I think, an advisable proviso to keep in mind when following the further argument. The extent, nature and consequences of the theism in Kierkegaard’s writing can be left to commentators. It is unclear how far the God whose presence Kierkegaard never appears to have escaped in his own life also pervades the texts, or to what extent any theism overflowing into the writing can be skimmed off the discourse as biography, allowing non-denominational readers to reap from the “rich repository of philosophically structured psychological observation” (p. 17). The polemical rhetoric of the pseudonyms has been noted. Might not the stringent theism surfacing in the later works be put there just to present contemporary clerics and colleagues in a bad light, or more widely to highlight the “mediocrity” that Kierkegaard claimed (again increasingly) to find everywhere? Others have suggested that the theism is what allows Kierkegaard the psychological insight that can open our eyes to our own frailty. They can agree with Bruce Kirmmse, who says in his introduction to The Lily of the Field and the Bird of the Air that Christianity is, for Kierkegaard, “a moral and spiritual exercise that has the ultimate purpose of teaching human beings their imperfection, their weakness and selfishness, in the face of the perfection, majesty and absolute otherness of God.”3 Of that slender book itself Kierkegaard says himself that he wrote it “without fighting with anybody and without speaking about myself.”4 But even if a theistic reading of Either/Or is correct, a non-theistic reading through the eyes of a putatively specious Kierkegaard can still teach us a lot. Stokes remains a “narrato-agnostic” in the narrativist versus “narrato-skeptic” debate on how to read Kierkegaard (p. 167). Readers may find it useful to follow that good example by remaining agnostic as to which Kierkegaard they are reading.

In the further analysis Stokes notes how Locke’s “concernful remembering” (p. 36) calls to mind Kierkegaard’s insightfully illustrated distinction between memory and recollection. Not always a matter of passively received copies of some (typically visual) experience, memory can be a present experience in which the self is currently engaged in something experienced earlier. Extensions of consciousness are “appropriations,” or “active exercise[s] of memory … proceed[ing] from a fundamental concern for oneself” (pp. 31-32). The concept of contemporaneity becomes central. In Philosophical Crumbs (also Fragments) it is the temporal relation the present-time believer has to the mind-baffling Incarnation, a relation that could not have been any closer through actual chronological simultaneity than for those who come after (see p. 79). In Stokes it is the way in which the self’s own past can be present to consciousness and, in this way, acquire a sense of a fulfilled or unfulfilled life. The root question forms a central topic in the post-Lockean literature. It concerns the occupancy of the subject position in (usually visually) imagined pasts or futures. I can visualize something without implying my own participation in the visualized past or in a future situation. But if I put myself there, the question arises of how the image connects to this occupant normatively in the way that Kierkegaard’s talk of reflexive memory (and anticipation) implies. Stokes suggests (the style is engagingly unassertive) that what Kierkegaard adds to both Lockean and neo-Lockean selfhood is a “description of how and under what conditions” consciousness extends to the past and future, so that we can point to where “identity-tracking features of memory come into play” (p. 45).

From there we move effortlessly to a phenomenology of personal identity able to accommodate a “robust soteriological normativity” (p. 45). The properly practical aspect can be traced in Kierkegaard’s shift from contemporaneity with Christ as a matter of “experience” in imagination to the later “active” view of his combative later years when the “requirement of Imitatio Christi” makes contemporaneity a form of “suffering” for the truth (p. 67). This “different understanding” of the concept is one on which the further analysis hangs. Stokes sees the wider meaning at work “throughout Kierkegaard’s works,” but the contemporaneity we end up with is, as we now expect, not as in Kierkegaard’s overt text a “property of purely religious experience.” We can re-understand it as one of “ordinary experience that applies when contemplating any situation that involves a sense that it concerns the contemplator directly and individually” (p. 81).

Being an achievement our sense of diachronic identity is open to failure and distortion. There can be “self-alienation” (p. 117). It too can be pervasive, particularly if we take Anti-Climacus’ word (“despair”) for it. A passage from The Sickness unto Death — as it happens the only one in Kierkegaard’s published writings where “naked” and" self " appear in apposition - captures this in its special way. The naked self is “the first form of the infinite self and the advancing impetus in the whole process by which a self infinitely becomes responsible for its actual self with all its difficulties and advantages” (p. 185). In one sense this has to do with our “concretion,” where we are compelled to start, but in another sense that situation is always one in which the advantages of selfhood come at a cost. Our sense of diachronic extension, backwards or forwards, can thus fail us, or more truthfully, we can fail it. On Stokes’ account, drawing again on contemporaneity, the “experience of identity [of self] is itself an experience of responsibility” (p. 105). This allows us to say that loss of selfhood can be something for which the self can be held accountable, which in turn assumes a self of sorts to whom responsibility for the failure can be attached. Hence that distinction, mentioned earlier and maintained throughout, between “our phenomenal sense of self and our reflective awareness of being a particular person.” It is Kierkegaard’s recurring theme of the human being as a psycho-somatic “synthesis” kept together by “spirit” that helps us towards "a way of thinking about personal identity that refuses to collapse the first and third-person perspectives, and the present-tense and diachronic perspectives on a self into a single perspective" (p. 216).

The Naked Self mediates between two traditions. Rather than standing apart as separate sources of distinct sets of questions about personal identity, in matters of soteriology Locke and Kierkegaard are found embracing each other. From early on, and in a spirit of “theological pragmatism,” Locke had seen that the understanding of personal identity we need in real life is one “good enough for the purposes of living with an eye to salvation” (p. 34) — or as we might say of any theory of personal identity that resorts to metaphysics: Sufficient unto the Day of Judgement is the truth thereof. Having at the outset disembarrassed Locke of the over-simplified and circular account of selfhood once attributed to him, though one that also set the whole discussion going, Stokes’ final claim brings him full circle:

What this engagement with Kierkegaard has allowed us to see is that selfhood may be an achievement on the part of the present-tense subject as it interrelates . . . various kinds of identity-claims — and, in a way that perhaps Locke would have approved of, he does this in a way that’s fundamentally normative. Metaphysics becomes the handmaiden of ethics, not the other way around (p. 231).

Stokes began by reassuring readers that Kierkegaard’s problems are not those he is being called on to help us to solve. He ends by answering skeptics who suspect nothing useful can be found in Kierkegaard on the problem of personal identity — the “facts of the matter” — and see little point in dwelling on subjective aspects that evade the grasp of metaphysics (and science). In reply, Stokes hints that a “de facto eliminativism that leaves our everyday experience untouched” would be obscurantist, and besides, there is no single problem of personal identity (p. 220). Apt words for signing off these necessarily selective comments on an admirably open-ended book that, clearly a work of much labor, bears its own history lightly and is itself a “rich repository” of structured observation in the cause of answering questions to which we still have no definitive answers.

1 Fear and Trembling, trans. A. Hannay, Penguin Books, 2014, p. 87.

2 Concluding Unscientific Postscript, trans. and ed. A. Hannay, Cambridge University Press, 2009, p. 259.

3 Søren Kierkegaard, The Lily of the Field and the Bird of the Air, trans. with intro. by Bruce Kirmmse, Princeton University Press, 2016, p. xii.

4 Kierkegaard’s Journals and Notebooks, ed. N. J. Cappelørn et al., Princeton University Press, vol. 9 (2016). NB 26:112.