The Nature of Human Persons: Metaphysics and Bioethics

The Nature Of Human Persons Metaphysics Anad Bioethics

Jason T. Eberl, The Nature of Human Persons: Metaphysics and Bioethics, University of Notre Dame Press, 2020, 405pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780268107734.

Reviewed by Patrick Toner, Wake Forest University


The focus of Jason T. Eberl's new book will come as a shock to nobody who has been reading his excellent contributions to metaphysics and bioethics for the last couple of decades. It is fundamentally a work in analytic metaphysics, drawing heavily on -- and doing some careful historical analysis of -- the thought of St. Thomas Aquinas, and applying those metaphysical insights to pressing bioethical matters, such as the nature of death.

The book has two main parts. The first part (Chapters 2-4) explains Thomistic hylemorphism according to Eberl, particularly its theory of human nature. Then he does some nice work explaining some competing theories of human nature, including several varieties of dualism and several varieties of materialism. The second part (Chapters 5-7) then turns to questions about the genesis of human beings, the death of human beings, and the afterlife of human beings. Chapter 1 is introductory material, and Chapter 8 is a concluding, very brief, look at the application of hylemorphism to abortion and the treatment of people in persistent vegetative states. The goals of the book seem to be to (a) explain the basics of hylemorphism, and to (b) argue that hylemorphism is not just a viable view, but indeed a better view than its principal contemporary competitors.

The introductory Chapter is fascinating: among other things, Eberl lays out a wonderful list of desiderata for any theory of human nature. It strikes me as an idiosyncratic batch of thoughts, which isn't to say I disagree with Eberl. But many will. The fourth desideratum, for example, is that "conscious thought processes -- of at least a certain type -- are explanatorily irreducible to neural functioning." (7) He notes that this does not imply substance dualism or even property dualism, since various forms of nonreductive physicalism could do the trick, so it is not as robust a claim as it might appear. But it's still a robust contention.

The second chapter presents the fundamentals of Thomistic hylemorphism, and does so in two main parts. The first bit of the chapter engages in a careful presentation of some technical ideas from St. Thomas regarding form/matter, soul/body, individuation, and identity. The second bit moves the chapter out of the 13th century and into the 21st, discussing hylemorphic approaches to things like the 'too many thinkers' argument, the problem of cerebrum transplants, and the difficulties of dicephalus cases. I have a great many disagreements with Eberl on technical points he makes in this chapter, but I would nevertheless say it's a very helpful and engaging presentation of this material, and Eberl does a masterful job of putting difficult Aristotelian notions into language that I think will make sense to the analytically-trained.

In Chapter Three, Eberl explains a couple of current versions of substance dualism, and showing how hylemorphism better coheres with his list of desiderata than dualism does. The main players are, I suppose unsurprisingly, Richard Swinburne and William Hasker. Eberl's task in Chapter Four is to lay out a few versions of materialism and show that hylemorphism does better than they do at satisfying the list. The target versions of materialism are Eric Olson's animalism, Lynne Rudder Baker's constitutionalism, Hud Hudson's four dimensionalism, and Jeff McMahon's embodied mind view. I should say that in addition to a simple compare-contrast or a mere analysis of how well the various views meet the list of desiderata, Eberl also uses these discussions to good advantage in further explaining hylemorphism.

The book's first section ends with a "Summative Excursus" that once again lays out the list of desiderata and walks us through the ways in which hylemorphism satisfies them. Eberl concludes that "Thomistic hylomorphism adds a distinctive voice to the contemporary debate concerning the nature of human persons." (140) I agree, and Eberl's book does indeed do a fine job of making that case.

We next turn to attempts to make sense of some difficult problems. When do human beings begin? When do they die? And once they die, might they still be . . . alive? Chapter Five clearly explains the Aristotelian notions of potentiality and applies them sagely to what we know about embryonic development. St. Thomas himself held a rather different scientific account of embryogenesis than we tend to nowadays, and that did lead to his holding some views about human development that many contemporary Thomists -- Eberl included -- reject. He held something like a delayed hominization view, according to which the embryo goes through a complex process of taking on and casting off forms, starting with a vegetative soul, moving to a sensible soul, and culminating eventually in its full acquisition of humanity upon receiving its rational soul. It has been hotly contested in the literature not merely what the truth of the matter about ensoulment is (given hylemorphic principles), but also what St. Thomas himself would likely say about the matter if he were to learn what we now know about biology. Eberl does a good job of walking us through the difficulties, and sides firmly with those who hold that, according to Thomistic principles, ensoulment occurs at conception.

Next, Eberl asks about human death: when do we die? He accepts a whole brain death criterion, according to which we die upon the (permanent, irreversible) cessation of the brain's functioning as the organ that integrates our bodily functions. The main thinker to the contrary in this chapter is Alan Shewmon, who has given some amazing cases of apparent human survival despite evident "brain death." (184-5) Shewmon thinks whole brain death is not sufficient for human death. Others think it is not necessary for human death: there are many who hold that the absence of higher-level function, such as we see in cases of persistent vegetative states, is sufficient for death, even though such people unambiguously do not meet the whole brain death standard. Eberl argues against this view, as well, on the basis (roughly speaking) of the unified account of human functioning available to him through hylemorphism.

The book's second section ends with a chapter on postmortem life for humans. Eberl has for a long time been a member of what is sometimes called the 'survivalist' school of thought, which holds that (according to Thomistic hylemorphism) persons survive their bodily death, literally. Not through being raised from the dead, but by still being there when only their soul exists. The opposing party, the 'corruptionists,' hold that human beings cease to exist when they die, and come to exist again upon resurrection -- despite the fact that of course their souls do persist in the interim and maintain their intellective and volitional powers. There is more to this chapter than the survivalist-corruptionist dispute. Here again we see the materialists and the substance dualists appear, and Eberl argues that hylemorphism handles postmortem existence and resurrection better than they do. We also have an interesting discussion of the persistence or otherwise of the body in the interim state, and the corresponding problem of what it means for my body to rise again.

Last, we have a very quick foray into the problems of abortion and the treatment of patients in persistent vegetative states. This chapter has a quick but useful discussion of the doctrine of double effect, and it says some provocative things about feeding and hydrating -- or, rather, not feeding or hydrating -- people in persistent vegetative states.

Some quick critical observations. I'll start where I ended. The discussion of feeding and hydrating PVS patients involves what strikes me as a substantive move that is not treated in a satisfactory way. Eberl had argued earlier that a patient in a PVS remains a person. This leaves open the question of whether such persons must have artificial nutrition and hydration (ANH) provided for them, and Eberl says no. There's much more to the story than I can cover here, but part of Eberl's case turns on a use of double effect wherein the intended end is that the patient's suffering not be prolonged, not that the patient die. Death is merely foreseen, nor is the patient's death willed as a means. But in what sense can we say that a PVS patient is suffering? Part of what it is to be in a persistent vegetative state is that there's irreversibly no conscious awareness. If the "PVS patient" were suffering due to her condition, then she wouldn't be a PVS patient. I don't say that Eberl couldn't possibly construct a more convincing argument for his views than what appears here, but I do think that what appears here is too quick (and rebuttable on grounds in addition to those I've already mentioned).

Similarly, although I myself didn't need any convincing about the impermissibility of abortion, I suspect many readers will: the final chapter feels to me like it does very little good and should either have been significantly expanded, or just left out.

Eberl's list of desiderata for a theory of human nature is, as I mentioned above, idiosyncratic. At least one member of the list -- the very first one -- confuses me. This item is that "it is possible for human beings to survive bodily death." (5) As you will recall, the point here is that a theory of human nature ought to be compatible with this claim. Now, the claim is not nearly as robust as may seem on a careless reading, since Eberl is asserting only that our theories should allow for the metaphysical possibility of survival, not that our theories should one and all assert that we are likely to in fact survive our deaths. But arguably any theory could be adjusted to allow for this metaphysical possibility. Peter van Inwagen's famous body snatching story gives the hint here. Our bodies die, the parts are snatched by God and reassembled, and bam, we live again! We don't need God to tell a story like this. It could just be a natural law of some kind that the bodies of deceased human beings get snatched and reassembled, contrary to appearance. If that's correct, then the first item on the list is trivial. To make it more meaningful, Eberl really needs a somewhat stronger claim, like "it is possible for human beings to survive their bodily deaths, and not in a tacked-on, arbitrary, goofy sort of way." But then this does turn the claim into a much more robust sort of constraint on theories of human nature, and the list would lose even more of its appearance of openness.

Eberl's discussion of the sameness of body was unsatisfying to me. The problem is roughly this: when I am resurrected, according to St. Thomas, I will have the same soul and the same body. But what does it mean for me to have the same body? Surely, my body will corrupt and scatter in the interval. Does God need to gather up my old parts somehow, and present them to my soul? Or can he just put my soul together with any matter, indiscriminately gathered, and get that matter (since it's informed by my soul) to count as my body? Eberl frames this as analogous to the Euthyphro problem: "Is something S's body because S's soul informs it, or does S's soul inform something because it is S's body?" (219) Eberl sides with the former: my soul can inform any old matter, and that makes it my body. I don't accept this way of framing the problem. In disagreeing with Eberl on the point, I do not affirm that my soul informs something because that thing is my body. That would be a significant oversimplification of the alternative to Eberl's reading of St. Thomas.

There's something like a citation error, too, in this discussion. Eberl cites a passage that he recognizes as contrary to his interpretation. ("if this matter remains the same, and from it a human body is restored by divine power, and if also the rational soul . . . is conjoined to the same body, it follows that numerically the same human being is resurrected.") But he follows this acknowledgement up with this: "Other passages, however, affirm that the numerical identity of the essential features of one's resurrected body . . . is secured by virtue of the body being informed by the numerically same soul." (220) In other words, Eberl is arguing that there's a tension in the texts of St. Thomas, some of which appear to support his view, and others of which appear not to. But what Eberl quotes as an "other passage" isn't another passage: it's the same passage, the very same chapter of the Compendium, following out the same line of thought. I disagree with Eberl's reading of the much more abstruse bit of text he uses to support his view, and it seems more promising to me to find a different reading than Eberl's than to assert that, within the brief overall passage, St. Thomas contradicts himself.

Another worry I have is that Eberl says that "for Aquinas, the terms human person, human animal, and human being are extensionally equivalent." (20) This is actually a pretty important idea, and I'm not convinced Eberl is correct. A crucial point that I think Eberl doesn't take seriously enough is the fact that the human nature of Christ is not a person (ST, III, 4, 2). This introduces a weird category into St. Thomas's ontology: the existence of what we might call a 'person-like thing,' for it has an intellect and will just like the rest of us. It's very much like us. But it's not a person. To my mind, this undermines one of Eberl's minor arguments in favor of survivalism: namely, that corruptionism requires us positing the weird category of disembodied human souls which occupy the weird ontological domain of person-like beings. It undermines it because it's not corruptionism which conjures up that category, but Christianity.

Despite the above friendly objections, I heartily recommend this book. It is well-written and carefully argued, with some passages of very insightful Thomistic exegesis, and brings together the fruits of Eberl's long-term research projects in an accessible one-volume work. It also draws heavily on many of Eberl's previously published pieces. One may wonder how much it overlaps with his previous book, Thomistic Principles and Bioethics (Routledge, 2006). The answer to that is: a fair bit, but the focus is quite different. It's particularly well-suited as a textbook in graduate courses in metaphysics, bioethics, or possibly philosophy of religion. I could see it being used in an advanced undergraduate course, though I think it would be a stretch in that context. This is an excellent work that specialists will argue with and non-specialists will learn much from.