The Nature of Philosophical Problems: Their Causes and Implications

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John Kekes, The Nature of Philosophical Problems: Their Causes and Implications, Oxford University Press, 2014, 238pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198712756.

Reviewed by Robert Almeder, Georgia State University


The author's Introduction begins with a quote from Ludwig Wittgenstein:

What is the use of studying philosophy if all it does for you is to enable you to talk with some plausibility about some abstruse questions of logic, etc., and if it does not improve your thinking about the important questions of everyday life. (vii)

Kekes then states that his aim is to explain why basic philosophical problems are perennial, why they are exceptionally difficult, and "why many centuries of hard work by excellent minds has not resulted in a generally acceptable solution of any of them" (vii). He believes that many excellent books and articles trading in ingenious counterexamples are, and have been, written with increasingly technical skill showing why contrary views cannot handle ever more ingenious counterexamples. But, he asserts, that their connection with the basic problems that prompted the highly skillful work "gets lost in the accumulation of increasingly complex detail whose significance only a handful of specialists working on that small segment of the basic problem can understand" (vii).

Kekes seeks further to explain why philosophical problems are, and will forever remain, perennial (i.e., without generally accepted solutions), and to say a little about how we might nevertheless cope with them reasonably in an effort to make our lives better and happier. He affirms also that in the modern world philosophy has changed; it has become an academic specialty. Research in it is a skill, with the sad consequence that philosophy has become increasingly remote from everyday life. Seldom, if ever, does philosophy seem to bear any relevance to basic problems about how to live in our complex and dangerous world.

In the Introduction Kekes asserts that as time passes and circumstances change, we continue to face the same problems about how we should live, e.g: what makes lives good, whether there is a providential order, what an ideal political state would be, how to control how we live, what we can reasonably hope, and whether there are moral absolutes. He notes that answering these questions would make our lives better, of course, but the many answers that have been proposed for each regularly conflict with, and exclude, one another. There are, of course, good reasons from different perspectives for each proposal. But the conflicts still persist in changing form throughout the ages, including this century. The difficulty, according to Kekes, is that the answers are based, not on the facts, but on conflicting evaluations of the significance of familiar facts. Defenders of conflicting evaluations disagree about which ones are right, and neither is able to trump the other because of the fundamentally exclusive nature of the evaluations. That is why these philosophical problems are perennial.

Philosophical problems arise, Kekes notes, when we try to form an overall understanding of the world and our situation in it. This can be done in one of two ways. The first treats the condition of our lives as one set of facts among countless others, and understanding those conditions helps us to improve our lives. The second focuses on improving our lives. Kekes claims that the two ways are fundamentally different, and give rise to different problems. He is fundamentally concerned with the problems that arise in the context of seeking the second kind of understanding, which he characterizes as anthropocentric and evaluative. He hastens to add that this second kind of understanding seeks to explain why philosophical problems are so difficult to solve or resolve and why the proposed approaches to coping with them are so controversial. That is his main concern in this book.

Kekes notes that the particular difficulty in finding the explanation we need comes from our having several different modes of understanding -- historical, moral, political, religious, cultural, scientific and personal. -- Collectively these modes lead to enduring and conflicting evaluations of the significance of the facts on which the improvement of our lives depends.

He also promises to propose an explanation suggesting an approach to finding the most reasonable evaluations of the relevant facts and cope with perennial philosophical problems about improving our lives, without professing to have solved those problems. For Kekes, then, few philosophical problems bearing on how to make our lives better can plausibly be solved, resolved or dissolved once and for all. We are all fallible.

In Part One, "From Modes of Understanding to Philosophical Problems," Kekes delineates the different modes of understanding and how they come into irresolvable conflict. He again raises philosophical questions, mostly bearing on understanding and bettering our human condition as paradigm philosophical questions arising out of everyday questions about how we should live in the context at hand, given the available facts involved, and what practical attitudes and resources we should adopt to that end.

In Part II, "Problematic Approaches," Kekes offers succinct and compelling analyses of the shortcomings of Philosophical Genealogy, Historical Philosophizing, Relativism, Moralism, and Morality without Moralism, Politics without Ideology, and Science without Scientism. Limits of space do not allow anything more than mentioning the scope and generally compelling set of reflections on these topics as they bear on how these modes of understanding inevitably promote the conflicted character of philosophical problems. His refutation of moralism, ideology, scientism, absolutism and relativism are well-constructed and convincing.

Part III, "Toward a Pluralistic Approach," is an effort to delineate a pluralistic approach to resolving conflicts between modes of understanding and coping with vital philosophical problems. Kekes argues (credibly I believe) that this approach is better than either the absolutist or the relativist approach, both of which are strikingly defective. Here again, he regularly reminds us that the philosophical problems he addresses bear on making our lives better in terms of what we can plausibly expect given variable circumstances and unique contextual, cultural, legal, religious, moral, scientific and historical considerations. Chapter nine deals with "good reasons" and treats sensitively, among other things, the question of where understanding and reasoned justification of our views must come to an end in common sense beliefs we all pretty much hold, given the available evidence and pervasively contingent circumstances. Reasons, of course, are presupposed in any challenge to the need for having justifying reasons. Any line of reasoning must come to an end in an act of faith that is fallible and can be challenged, but then only by another act of faith. The latter good for the moment under the circumstances but still subject to reflection and revision going forward in a world of changing and incomplete evidence.

Kekes agrees with Nagel that there are some acts of faith, that there "are some types of thought that we cannot avoid simply having -- that it is strictly impossible to consider merely from the outside" (157). This extends to practical reasoning and moral reasoning within our point of view. Even so, he affirms that "when it is all said and done, the best we can do in the context of deciding how we should live is to hold relevant beliefs and perform relevant actions that after critical reflection we have reason to endorse and no reason to suspect" (162). Those reasons, however, will still be particular and conditional, rather than universal and general.

His overall discussion on the role and limits absolutism and relativism and why those positions fail in the light of his defense of pluralism is well done as an approach to rationally coping with perennial philosophical problems. Also well done is his treatment of theoretical and practical reasons in coping with philosophical reasoning.

In Part III, Kekes turns to answering the vital questions he articulated in the Introduction. Space does not allow for a fuller discussion here of his answers to these proposed questions. Naturally, the answers he offers are not intended to be definitive answers to perennial philosophical problems. Rather they are presented as the best available contingent solutions under the circumstances to vital questions that bear on our capacity to make our lives better. Certainly, I warmly recommend his careful and well-crafted treatment of these vital questions. They are deserving of serious consideration.

In sum, for Kekes, philosophical problems are perennial because the answers variously proposed to them are arguably without any hope of non-controversial agreement in the philosophical community. The answers proposed are invariably incapable of avoiding basic conflicts in modes of reasoning interpreting basic facts.

His solution to this problem lies in his understanding of a pluralism that provides us with the virtue of being able to cope with these problems without absolutism or relativism by providing some measure of common sense suitable to, if only temporarily and contextually, making our lives better as far as we can see.

This is not the place to enter into an extended critique of the core arguments in this book. Even so, one cannot help but feel that for Kekes the prospect of offering real solutions to philosophical problems will forever be like searching for El Dorado or tilting at windmills if philosophy is to be relevant to making our lives better. That seems a bit too pessimistic if we are willing to grant that some arguments are better than others in defending philosophical answers to philosophical problems.

There is a strong tendency among philosophers and others to credit natural science with a capacity for real solutions and settled beliefs useful for bettering our lives. However, the same cannot be said about proposed solutions to philosophical questions. Many people will think that philosophical questions are interesting, to be sure, but have no agreed upon answers for just the sorts of reasons Kekes gives. But perhaps this tendency is just a matter of assuming that natural science offers enduring justifications for its beliefs about the world, whereas philosophy offers none, or at least none free from intractable controversy.

Then, too, we must not forget that in the past natural science has made serious mistakes, even though at the time, the answers were considered definitively true. Some examples that immediately come to mind include the phlogiston theory of combustion, the caloric theory of heat, the geocentric theory, and absolute space and time. It is as difficult to overestimate the success of natural science and the fallible nature of scientific conclusions as it is to underestimate the success of philosophical answers to some philosophical problems. Even so, Kekes has tapped into a fairly pervasive sentiment about the benefit of philosophical reasoning.

All things considered, I recommend this book as an illuminating, engaging, and convincing discussion on an important topic.