The New Phenomenology: A Philosophical Introduction

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J. Aaron Simmons and Bruce Ellis Benson, The New Phenomenology: A Philosophical Introduction, Bloomsbury, 2013, 285pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441182838.

Reviewed by Frédéric Seyler, DePaul University


This book is conceived as an introduction to what is designated "new phenomenology". According to the authors, new phenomenology is constituted by a "family" of contemporary French philosophers inspired by phenomenology: E. Lévinas, J. Derrida, M. Henry, J.-L. Marion, J.-L. Chrétien (and "to some extent, but in importantly different respects" (2): J.-Y. Lacoste and P. Ricœur, although these thinkers will not be part of the investigation). Based largely on D. Janicaud's 1992 critique of the "theological turn" in French phenomenology, though with the addition of Derrida, "new phenomenologists" are identified as going "beyond the specifics of Husserlian and Heideggerian thought in key ways. Most famously . . . [they] 'go beyond' historical phenomenology in their willingness to consider God and religious existence" (2). Furthermore, the authors echo F.-D. Sebbah's analysis of Derrida, Lévinas and Henry, an analysis according to which these thinkers "are all engaged in working out what phenomenology itself requires, assumes, and supposes" (4).

The book does not proceed by devoting separate chapters to each of the five philosophers, but instead uses their relationship to philosophy of religion as the federating theme. In this context, the goal is to establish three main theses: i) "New phenomenology can be legitimately considered an heir to historical phenomenology when understood as a general path of inquiry into phenomenality" (7); ii) "New phenomenology should be weighed and considered in light of a variety of contemporary philosophical problems" (8); and iii) "New phenomenology can be productively put into conversation with other contemporary philosophical perspectives regardless of whether those perspectives are traditionally associated with 'continental' philosophy" (8). This third thesis refers in particular to a possible dialogue between new phenomenology and analytical philosophy of religion (chapter 7). In summary, the book pursues an ambitious threefold agenda: to introduce the philosophies of Lévinas, Derrida, Henry, Marion and Chrétien; to establish the three theses mentioned and to show perspectives of dialogue with analytical philosophy of religion. This agenda is pursued through eight chapters with promising titles: The sources of new phenomenology in Husserl and Heidegger (Ch. 1); How to be a phenomenological heretic: The origins and development of new phenomenology (Ch. 2); Phenomenology and onto-theology (Ch. 3); Phenomenology and theology reconsidered (Ch. 4); New phenomenology on the existence and nature of God (Ch. 5); The call, prayer, and Christian philosophy (Ch. 6); Proposals for new phenomenology and analytic philosophy of religion (Ch. 7) and Normativity: Ethics, politics, and society (Ch. 8).

The question is, of course, if such an ambitious goal can be attained through a single publication, especially when one considers the fact that it aims at being a philosophical introduction to five different and highly complex thinkers while, at the same time, wishing to reach out into even more specialized domains such as the dialogue with analytical philosophy or questions about normativity.

There is certainly a need for both introductory and research-oriented publications on Henry, Marion and Chrétien in the English-speaking world. These thinkers are indeed central to contemporary French philosophy, and their resonance reaches far beyond phenomenological circles, as can be seen in their common concern for religion. And it is certainly appropriate to engage them in a dialogue with Lévinas and Derrida. One also has to be sympathetic with Simmons and Benson when they stress, despite Janicaud's critique, that "the new phenomenologists judiciously guard against allowing in evidence that comes from non-phenomenological sources -- that is, from something other than what gives itself" (132). At least it has to be acknowledged that these works are philosophical as long as they do not base their arguments on religious faith, and that they are essential in their endeavor to think the foundations of phenomenality in the form of what exceeds and, at the same time, conditions the appearing of intentional objects. This interest with phenomenological "excess" and, in many cases, with a phenomenological philosophy of religion is connected to the idea (already emphasized philosophically by Kierkegaard) that "I am not my own origin and I am not able to rest secure in my own power" (149). As the authors further highlight, it is important to note that all these thinkers were schooled in the Heideggerian critique of onto-theology and that their approach to religion is informed by such a critique as well as by phenomenological concepts. In this sense, one cannot stress enough the innovative power of these thinkers for a philosophy of religion deeply rooted in lived experience. Simmons and Benson succeed in conveying this all-important point.

However, they are less successful with regard to some other important goals they set, namely those of providing a philosophical introduction as well as "an extended discussion of new phenomenology as it concerns philosophy of religion, but also as it concerns ethics, political philosophy, methodology, hermeneutics, and even questions of normativity more broadly" (236).

The main reason for this lies in the lack of conceptual analysis with regard to key concepts in new phenomenology or to phenomenology in general. As philosophy stands and falls with concepts, there can be simply no philosophical understanding (and therefore no philosophical discussion) without such an analysis.

To write, for instance, that

new phenomenologists have not been interested in God or religion as such but have instead been interested in exploring the ways in which non-intentional intuition might be possible such that there might be things given to consciousness that do not 'appear' in any straightforward way (74)

leaves the reader wondering what is meant by "non-intentional intuition" or by "not 'appearing' in any straightforward way" and, ultimately, by "new phenomenologists". It also leaves the phenomenologist wondering how such terms can be justified phenomenologically. To conclude that "this is what leads Levinas to consider alterity, Marion to consider givenness, Henry to consider the auto-affection of life" (74) is an important countersense at least on Marion (who considers givenness as exceeding intuition) and on Henry (who, long before Marion, considered auto-affection as strictly non-intuitive because it is non-intentional appearing). Such errors should be avoided at all cost in both scholarly and introductory writings.

A second example is given in the same sentence with respect to the central concept of auto-affection, which is nowhere explained or discussed. Again this leads to countersense-propositions:

For Henry, the essence of manifestation (or the Truth of Life) is something that cannot itself be made manifest (and thereby accord with the Truth of the World). In this sense, Henry offers an extended phenomenological account of 'a place where no one appeared', as it were (120)

or "Henry . . . distinguishes . . . the 'Word of the World' and the 'Word of Life' in order to note the depth of phenomenality beyond all phenomenalization" (121) are statements that actually reverse Henry's position. On the contrary, it is because Life is phenomenalization that it is appearing, that it appears to itself (auto-affection) and thus to the living. For Henry, there is absolutely no phenomenological account possible of what does not appear. A phenomenology of life is only possible because life does appear, and the originality of Henry's work lies in the concept of non-intentional appearing as affectivity. It is therefore correct to state that "intentionality is suspended" (62), but not that it is "in order to allow the object to be manifest in total immanence" (62) since here immanence is precisely the absence of subject-object division as well as the undivided presence of living subjectivity. To state that "here the focus is on the object that is given, rather than on the subject that intends the object" (62) is, again, to reverse completely Henry's phenomenology of radicalized subjectivity.

With regard to the extension of the discussion in chapter 8 on normativity, one would further have to discuss the concept of democracy when asserting that "the rise of barbarism . . . is closely connected to the question of democracy" (229). In the context of Henry's thought, this can only be done by referring to not yet translated articles such as "La vie et la république" (1989) and "Difficile démocratie" (2000), or to books such as Du Communisme au Capitalisme. Théorie d'une Catastrophe (1990), which are not mentioned. Otherwise Henry's critique of contemporary democracy is simply overlooked.

On a more methodological note, and given that the authors refer extensively to Janicaud, it would be useful to know if the sources include not only The Theological Turn (French original 1992), but also its important sequel La Phénoménologie Éclatée (1999). Since the bibliography mentions only the English translation (2000), this seems unlikely. In general, publication dates for the original French editions would have been welcomed, as with the case of Sebbah's Ph.D. thesis Testing the Limit, which seems to be a major source of inspiration for the authors, but was published more than a decade ago. As valuable as his book is, a scholarly publication on contemporary French phenomenology should also take into account more recent scholarly work done in French on the relevant thinkers and topics. After all, this principle applies (or should apply) in the same way to French researchers working on Anglo-American philosophers. One would then be able to see that connected research on ethics, political philosophy and aesthetics is not merely a prospect for the future, as the authors seem to imply, but part of the currently existing corpus of secondary sources.

Further conceptual and methodological problems arise when common traits are ascribed to new phenomenology in general. To assert that "one of the upshots of new phenomenological philosophy of religion is the requirement of an infinite hermeneutic task" (150) is, for instance, perfectly accurate with regard to Ricœur, but perfectly incorrect with regard to Henry, whose critique of intentionality is tied to a refusal of hermeneutics as part of the phenomenological method. This should also be a reason to revise the meaning of new phenomenology, since it appears to be impossible to assign this common trait to all the thinkers considered.

An alternative can be found in Sebbah's distinction between a "family" of phenomenological thinkers that defend a radicalized conception of subjectivity (Lévinas, Henry and, to some extent, Derrida, if one follows Sebbah) and a "family" that aims towards an a-subjective phenomenology (according to Sebbah: Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty. One could add J. Patocka or R. Barbaras). It is also likely that philosophers referring to religion like Marion or Chrétien would find their place in the first "family". This means that the designation "new phenomenology" should be replaced or, better, simply abandoned. In addition to the fact that it is already used by H. Schmitz to designate his own phenomenology -- a terminological decision by the author that is worthy of respect (as in the case of "radical phenomenology", which is one of the designations for Henry's phenomenology) -- it is obvious that some thinkers like M. Richir and Barbaras, for instance, would certainly not fit into new phenomenology as defined by Simmons and Benson, and yet they are doubtless new phenomenologists in France, both in the literal sense as well as in comparison to "historical" phenomenology.

If "new phenomenology" is to be kept as a designation at all, it should encompass all phenomenological endeavors that are innovative with regard to Husserl and, to some extent, to Heidegger. Considering the examples of Richir and Barbaras, it appears that today's French phenomenology is clearly not homogenous and not limited to orientations that Janicaud polemically described as the "theological turn". In light of what is at stake in today's phenomenological debates, not only in France, but also on a global scale, the distinction between a phenomenology of (radicalized) subjectivity and an a-subjective phenomenology seems much more accurate than the distinction between "new" and "old". Furthermore, this distinction does not at all diminish the importance of phenomenological philosophies of religion, which, in most if not in all cases, will find themselves on the side of the living subject.

Last but not least, this draws our attention to the urgent task of investigating the meaning as well as the boundaries of phenomenology itself.