The New Science of the Mind: From Extended Mind to Embodied Phenomenology

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Mark Rowlands, The New Science of the Mind: From Extended Mind to Embodied Phenomenology, MIT Press, 2010, 249pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262014557.

Reviewed by Robert D. Rupert, University of Colorado at Boulder


In recent years, much has been written about situated cognition, a movement in cognitive science that appears to have important philosophical implications (Robbins and Aydede 2009). Agents of this situated turn expound a variety of positive views; thus, at least initially, the movement may be best explained in terms of what its practitioners reject. The great majority of situated theorists direct their philosophical ire at a computer-based vision of human thought that came to prominence in the 1960s. According to this computationalist view (as it's called), thought proceeds by the application of stored rules to inputs -- inputs of the sort that enter a desktop computer via keystrokes -- to generate outputs. The mathematical theory of computation (Boolos, Burgess, and Jeffrey 2002) tells us that any problem that can be solved by a series of orderly steps can be solved by a digital computer. The human mind has appeared to many to be just such an all-purpose problem-solver, especially to theorists focusing on such tasks as chess playing; and thus, as the twentieth century wore on, it became increasingly common to think that having a mind is to be an all-purpose computer, or at least to be something near enough. With the arrival of neuroimaging systems and other high-tech recording tools, much research in cognitive science began to focus on the way in which the brain -- our human "wetware" -- carries out computations; this brand of cognitive science is equally anathema to those who embrace the situated perspective. To summarize, the core negative thesis of the situated view is this: the human mind is not simply the computing brain.

But if human thought isn't the activity of a computing brain, what is it? Situated theorists claim that, in order for us to answer this question fully, we must pay close attention to the actual material environment in which human cognition takes place and to the way in which we use our bodies -- our whole bodies -- to interact with the world during problem-solving. The brain might be a computer of sorts, but to understand what kind of computing it does, its problem-solving strategies, and so on, we must examine the various ways in which the brain, body, and world work together to produce what we recognize as intelligent behavior. To make this proposal slightly more concrete, consider that most humans must use external tools, such as a calculator or pencil and paper, to solve problems that require long division. Thus, the idea runs, any adequate account of human cognition must incorporate such tool-using processes into its models of problem-solving.

Situated views came to the fore in the 1990s. Among the early philosophical proponents were Andy Clark and David Chalmers, Susan Hurley, Robert Wilson, John Haugeland, and Mark Rowlands. Rowlands's The New Science of the Mind (NSM) nicely updates and expands upon this earlier work (Rowlands 1999, in particular). In NSM, Rowlands advocates for what he calls an 'amalgamated' conception of mental processes: they frequently comprise both neural and nonneural bodily processes, as well as processes beyond the boundary of the organism. He defends this view against extant criticisms and, partly as a way of doing so, develops a highly original account of what it is for a subject to own a cognitive process.

I. Outline and Summary

Chapters 1-3 set the stage. In them, Rowlands articulates various forms of the situated approach to cognition, explains some related scientific work, lays out basic conceptual machinery, and makes his own guiding assumptions explicit.

Rowlands identifies four species of the situated view. Perhaps the most radical of the four, the extended-mind thesis, holds that cognition is constituted partly by elements or processes beyond the boundary of the organism. According to the second -- the embodied view -- cognition is constituted partly by nonneural, bodily processes. Rowlands accepts the extended and embodied views but is critical of a third, the embedded approach. On the embedded view, genuine cognition occurs inside the organism only -- perhaps only in the skull -- but cognitive processing depends, in surprising and extensive ways, on the contribution of the environment (Rupert 2004). The embedded view is often wielded in appeasement; it serves as a kind of salve for the computationalist, allowing her to acknowledge the contributions of the environment and nonneural body while still holding that real cognition takes place in the computer that is the brain (6). Separating the basic commitments of these three views is straightforward enough, at least at a first pass (but see 103-104, Clark 2008, and Rupert 2009a).

The fourth situated perspective, the enactive view, complicates the conceptual terrain. The enactive view claims a special role for action in the constitution of cognition -- perception, in particular. One does not simply open one's eyes and see, according to the enactivists. Rather, seeing is something one does, by interacting with one's environment and learning how various forms of bodily movement correspond to changes in one's visual sensations. The taxonomical place of the enactive view, relative to the others, is less than clear. Since the actions in question -- the actions that partly constitute seeing, on the enactivist view -- include bodily movement and interactions with external material, the enactive view seems to entail either the embodied or extended one, or Rowlands's amalgamation of the two. (Note in this regard that, although Rowlands criticizes leading enactivist views [in chapter 3], he ultimately expounds a position with a deeply enactivist strand. Rowlands's route to his positive proposal differs so greatly, however, from the one taken by leading enactivists [e.g., Noë 2004] that it's reasonable for Rowlands to eschew the enactivist label.)

In the category of influential scientific work, Rowlands surveys classic research by Luria and Vygotsky, David Marr, J. J. Gibson, and Rodney Brooks, as well as more recent literature on inattentional and change blindness. In some ways this is a judicious selection of topics, but the limited and dated nature of the scientific coverage raises questions about Rowlands's goals, a matter to which I return presently.

To help nonspecialist readers along, Rowlands includes free-standing boxes which explain basic philosophical and cognitive-scientific concepts and distinctions. Those unfamiliar with topics related to realization, identity theory, modality, connectionist nets, and the basic forms of memory would do well to read these carefully.

Lastly, it is worth drawing attention to two of Rowlands's central assumptions. First, he is at pains to distinguish his activity-oriented approach from one that focuses on states. It is not because certain external states have the static properties they do that they are cognitive, according to Rowlands; rather, it is because they sometimes form part of the process of a subject's extracting information from the environment, and it is only then that such components of the world are cognitive. Part of Rowlands's point here is to distance himself from state-oriented claims made by Clark and Chalmers. In their highly influential paper, "The Extended Mind" (Clark and Chalmers 1998), Clark and Chalmers describe the way in which an external object (a notepad, in their widely discussed example of Otto) can be poised to participate in thought, say, by carrying information that the subject can use, when she needs it, to guide her behavior. So long as certain conditions on access are met, Clark and Chalmers count the object itself as part of the subject's memory or as the material encoding of one of the subject's dispositional beliefs. This renders the object, or some portion of it, cognitive even while it sits inactive -- in the same way our inactive memories (memories not being currently called up and contemplated) or dispositional beliefs are cognitive. In contrast, Rowlands insists that the object has cognitive status only when the subject actively extracts information from it. According to Rowlands (63-67), this insulates his view from certain problems to which Clark and Chalmers's state-oriented approach falls prey. This disagreement might strike some readers as an exercise in academic hair-splitting; but, in fact, Rowlands's focus on the active processes of information manipulation and extraction plays a central role in his project: it lays the conceptual groundwork for his positive theory of the cognitive subject.

Second, Rowlands emphasizes the importance of metaphysics in contrast to epistemology: the extended and embodied views with which he is concerned assert that some nonneural processes literally constitute cognition (in some cases), not merely that attention to bodily processes and worldly interactions helps us to understand cognition.

Chapter 4 acts as Rowlands's organizational lynchpin. Here he responds to criticisms of the extended and embodied views, arguing that the most well-known of these criticisms reduce to a single one -- the demand for a plausible mark of the cognitive (Adams and Aizawa 2001). The debates may rage on about other alleged difficulties for the amalgamated view (about the differences argument, the causal-constitution fallacy, and cognitive bloat), but we cannot resolve such debates until we have in hand a well-supported mark of the cognitive, that is, a convincing theoretical characterization of what it is for something to qualify as cognitive. This brilliant bit of dialectical jujitsu puts Rowlands in a position to parry all extant criticisms simply by defending his own mark.

In chapter 5, Rowlands sets out his mark of the cognitive in the form of a four-part criterion (satisfaction of which is sufficient, although perhaps not necessary, for a process to be cognitive):

A process P is a cognitive process if:

1. P involves information processing -- the manipulation and transformation of information-bearing structures.

2. This information processing has the proper function of making available either to the subject or to subsequent processing operations information that was, prior to this processing, unavailable.

3. This information is made available by way of the production, in the subject of P, of a representational state.

4. P is a process that belongs to the subject of that representational state. (110-111)

The ownership condition is the most controversial of the four and the most difficult to spell out clearly. In consequence, the remainder of NSM develops a theory of ownership that can undergird the amalgamated view.

Here is the gist of the argument from chapters 6-8, as I read them. There is a distinction between personal and subpersonal processes. Intentionality is a central feature of personal-level cognition. Processing is owned by the subject if it causally contributes to the determination of the intentional object of personal-level states (that is, if it helps to play the reference-determining role of Fregean senses). With respect to many of our personal-level cognitive states, embodied and extended processes make just this sort of causal contribution. Put slightly differently: many personal-level cognitive states are states with intentional objects; the subject owns these states and whatever processes causally contribute to the connecting of these states to their intentional objects; in many cases, nonneural activity contributes causally to the determination of this intentional relation; thus, in such cases (so long as the processes in question also satisfy the other three conditions in Rowlands's criterion), cognition is either embodied or extended or both.

II. Critical Reactions

As much as I liked this book, I often found myself wondering about its exact place in the literature on situated cognition. More often than not, the discussion seemed too far removed from contemporary scientific work. Nearly all of the scientific literature surveyed is at least fifteen years old, some of it decades old. To be fair, Rowlands states, early on, that his new science is "largely aspirational" (25); but to my mind that takes most of the punch out of his arguments. I was hoping to find reasons to think that cognitive science is undergoing a paradigm shift or a revolution, as is often claimed. As Rowlands remarks, though, his work speaks to a science "that does not yet exist" (ibid.). This creates a certain tension, perhaps most pointed when Rowlands claims that he will defend his criterion of the cognitive via "examination of cognitive-scientific practice" (119).

Along these lines, it is striking that Rowlands's discussion of ownership draws almost exclusively on the work of Frege, Husserl, Heidegger, and Sartre. According to Rowlands, their writings about intentionality establish the need for a reference-fixing act on the part of the subject, an act that connects the subject in the appropriate way to the objects of her representational states. Given the naturalistic outlook of the sciences (including, of course, cognitive science), one might have expected Rowlands to exploit the work of naturalistic semanticists (Fodor, Dretske, Millikan, among many others) to account for the subject's connection to the intentional objects of her cognitive states. Consideration of such naturalistic theories -- particularly causal-historical versions of them -- raises the worry, however, that Rowlands has cast cognition's net too broadly. I can think about Sweden, but I've never been there; the causal chain that achieves such intentional connectedness ranges far out into the world, through the media and many other people. What scientific utility might there be to the inclusion of all of this as part of cognition? Problems of cognitive bloat appear insurmountable when we focus on more extended causal chains, for example, the chains involved in my thinking about Jupiter or about Aristotle. In such cases, all manner of spatio-temporally distant things causally contribute, by transitive causal chains, to the fixation of my intentional content, and thereby seem to qualify, for Rowlands, as cognitive.

So far as I can tell, Rowlands's conditions 1-3 do not immunize his view against this kind of objection. Presumably the light emitted by Jupiter is part of the Gibsonian optic array; thus, if, as Rowlands claims, moving one's body with respect to the optic array suffices for the active exploitation of information in the environment (122), Rowlands's conditions seem to yield the result that Jupiter is part of a cognitive process, at least in the circumstances in which I'm craning my neck and the like in order to get a better view of Jupiter. In fact, I think Rowlands has made a mistake in this regard. The optic array, as an objective, external source of information, is not changed by my actions, at least not with respect to the information coming from the objects of my perception. While I'm craning my neck and whatnot, Jupiter simply "sits there," giving off a steady flow (a steadily fluctuating flow, anyway) of information. Rather, what changes is the portion of the optic array that I happen to be accessing (via the creation of internal representations, even if only fleeting ones). Rowlands might consider taking this point on board as a way of responding to the Jupiter objection; but by doing so, he would thereby abandon one of his most heavily relied upon scientific examples -- Gibson's work on perception -- as ground for (at least the extended aspect of) his amalgamated view. Perhaps Rowlands's ends would be better served were he to say more about the nature of processes -- are they causally connected series of states, or something else? -- and about the allowable causal contributors -- why isn't my body's causal manipulation of a linguistic representation of Aristotle part of a causal process that reaches back millennia? Here the goal would be to characterize local manipulations in such a way that screens off causal processes that extend into more distant regions of space-time.

At this point, however, one might be tempted simply to screen off all of the external causal processes from the category of the cognitive, that is, to opt for an embedded view over the extended one. As I argue elsewhere (Rupert 2004, 2009a, 2010), we should prefer the embedded view in deference to conservatism and simplicity (as well as to further considerations concerning the cognitive architecture, discussed below). Cognitive scientists can, and often do, recognize the need for causal connections between subjects and the objects they think about. Normally, however, they treat the subject's relation to such objects as mere causal relations; they treat such relations in the embedded fashion. Calling the full range of causal processes involved in the achievement of these intentional connections 'cognitive' thus seems to be an exercise in mere relabeling or a stipulative redeployment of our concepts.

I wondered too about the relation between, on the one hand, cognitive science and, on the other, Rowlands's personal-subpersonal distinction and his appeal to proper functions. I doubt that working cognitive science has much use for either of these theoretical constructs. With regard to the existence of distinctively personal-level states, Rowlands often seems to rely on what might be called the 'argument from italicized pronouns' (and related words, such as 'author' and 'owner') (141-142, 145, 151, 215-216). This common-sense insistence on the existence of a personal level, with its own integrity, is puzzling given that Rowlands takes a deflationary attitude toward minds, selves, and persons (8-9, 145) and does not fully embrace the frequently made philosophical claim that personal-level states are all and only the conscious ones (144). More importantly, successful cognitive modeling seems to support Rowlands's deflationary attitude toward these personal-level constructs rather than his fundamental reliance on distinctly personal-level states or processes.

Moving on to proper functions, note that Rowlands adopts the etiological notion borrowed from Millikan (112). Such functions seem largely irrelevant, though, to cognitive science. Cognitive scientists take what they intuitively categorize as intelligent behavior and try to model the systems that produce such behavior (and there is ongoing interplay between theoretical development and observation, as a result of which some observable phenomena are re-categorized). Thinking about evolutionary (or learning) history might help us guess at the right models to build and test; but the proof of the pudding -- as well as the ontological oomph -- lies in the success of one's models, and successful modeling is insensitive to the historical factors in question (unless of course one is out to model changes over time).

I was also somewhat dissatisfied with Rowlands's interpretation of my work (86-91), particularly in relation to the differences argument and the Parity Principle; but consideration of such details would take us too far afield (see Rupert 2009b for my attempt to straighten out some common misreadings of Rupert 2004; also see "Outline of one of the main arguments of Rupert" [2004]). There is one point in this vicinity, however, on which Rowlands and I fundamentally agree: that the resolution of the debate turns on the proper identification of subjects -- that is, on our locating "integrated cognitive agents or thinking subjects" (Rupert 2004, 425). In my estimation, though, this observation grounds a direct argument against the extended view: cognitive science seems to proceed, and to succeed, by investigating the capacities of persisting systems, and these would appear to be contained in human bodies (Rupert 2004, 425-428). In more recent work (Rupert 2009a, 2010), I have moved beyond these merely methodological claims to a more positive picture, arguing that the central theoretical construct of cognitive science -- whether connectionist, computationalist, or dynamicist -- is the integrated, persisting cognitive architecture. Particular instances of (what we take to be) intelligent behavior -- the explananda of cognitive science -- are modeled as the effects of the way in which the architectural components work in tandem to control or manage responses to varying stimuli and objects in the environment (Segal 1991, Wilson 2002); such architectures seem, for the most part, to be instantiated (only contingently!) within the boundary of human skin and skull. Moreover, attempts to reinterpret cognitive science so as to draw the boundary elsewhere strike me as otiose; from the standpoint of philosophy of science, they are unnecessary reinterpretations of current successful practice.

Thus, Rowlands and I agree that much of the debate ultimately turns on something like the ownership condition, that is, on the identification of the persisting subject of cognitive states. But, whereas I think we should identify that system by abstraction from modeling practices in contemporary cognitive science and restrict cognition to the activity taking place within systems so identified, Rowlands distinguishes the personal from the subpersonal level and counts as cognitive those causal factors contributing in the right way to the production of personal-level states. I contend that the former approach is not only truer to the subject matter but also does a better job of accommodating the data without unnecessary revision.

III. Concluding Remarks

Rowlands takes the reader on a clear and provocative philosophical romp. I have raised a number of objections, but readers willing to see Rowlands's project in its intended light will readily lay most of these aside. Rowlands argues for an activity- or process-oriented theory of intentionality and pursues its implications for situated views of the mind. The resulting package runs more toward historically well-informed philosophy of mind than it does toward philosophy of cognitive science. Approached in this spirit, NSM is a delightful and satisfying read.

Acknowledgements: Thanks to Mark Rowlands and David Chalmers for feedback on an earlier draft of this review.

Works Cited

Adams, F., and Aizawa, K. (2001). The Bounds of cognition. Philosophical Psychology 14: 43-64.

Boolos, G., Burgess, J., and Jeffrey, R. (2002). Computability and logic, fourth edition. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Clark, A. (2008). Pressing the flesh: A tension in the study of the embodied, embedded mind. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 76, 1, 37-59.

Clark, A., and Chalmers, D. (1998). The extended mind. Analysis 58, 7-19.

Noë, A. (2004). Perception in action. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Robbins, P., and Aydede, M. (eds.) (2009). The Cambridge handbook of situated cognition. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Rowlands, M. (1999). The body in mind: Understanding cognitive processes. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Rupert, R. D. (2004). Challenges to the hypothesis of extended cognition. Journal of Philosophy, 101, 389-428.

Rupert, R. D. (2009a). Cognitive systems and the extended mind. New York: Oxford University Press.

Rupert, R. D. (2009b). Critical notice of Andy Clark's Supersizing the Mind, Journal of Mind and Behavior, 30, 4, 313-30.

Rupert, R. D. (2010). Extended cognition and the priority of cognitive systems. Cognitive Systems Research, 11, 4, 343-356.

Segal, G. (1991). Defence of a reasonable individualism. Mind, 100, 4, 485-494.

Wilson, M. (2002). Six views of embodied cognition. Psychonomic Bulletin & Review, 9, 4, 625-636.