The Normative Thought of Charles S. Peirce

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Cornelis de Waal and Krysztof Piotr Skowronski (eds.), The Normative Thought of Charles S. Peirce, Fordham University Press, 2012, 344pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780823242443.

Reviewed by Robert Talisse, Vanderbilt University


This volume contains eleven new essays exploring Charles Peirce's views about normativity. The international roster of contributors includes many well-established Peirce scholars as well as younger philosophers. The book is the product of a 2007 week-long "philosophic retreat" (xii) held in Opole, Poland and organized by Krysztof Piotr Skowronski and Nathan Hauser. Topics run the gamut from the application of Peircean semiotic to the aesthetics of jazz and musical improvisation (Vincent Colapietro and Kelly A. Parker), to the applicability of Peirce's views about realism to issues in meta-ethics (James Liszka, Rosa Maria Mayorga, and Sami Philstrom), to matters concerning the methodology of moral inquiry and the relation of morality to science (Cornelis de Waal, Mats Bergman, Helmut Pape). The chapters are uniformly well-written, their authors deeply immersed in the intricacies of Peirce's texts., Many of the chapters represent state-of-the-art Peirce scholarship. Consequently, I highly recommend the book to those working on the normative dimensions of Peirce's thought.

The animating force behind many of the chapters is the curious fact that pragmatism's founder seems to have held moral philosophy in exceedingly low regard. In his 1898 Cambridge lectures, Peirce goes so far as to claim that ethics is a "dangerous study" and "useless." He then counsels us to "obey the traditional maxims of your community without hesitation or discussion." There are many reasons why such pronouncements seem odd. For one thing, Peirce famously held that reasoning or inquiry -- the model of which forms the basis of much of his philosophy -- is a kind of conduct, and much of his philosophy is bound up with the project of discerning the marks of good, responsible, and proper reasoning. In fact, Peirce claims that logic is the science of "self-control", and the pragmatic maxim is, after all, a maxim. A related point is that pragmatism in all of its forms wants to tether philosophical theorizing to human habits and practices, and there is no doubt that moral assessment and deliberation play a central role in human lives. Hence the puzzle: normativity of some kind lies at the very heart of Peirce's thought, especially in those exaggerated moments where he depicts himself as a hard-nosed laboratory scientist with no tolerance for "make-believes," "jargon," and "nonsense," yet he frequently dismisses ethics as an area of inquiry.

It should be noted, of course, that Peirce is not univocal on these matters. In his architectonic writings, for example, one finds Ethics listed among the "normative sciences" (along with Logic and Esthetics). In a text from 1904, Peirce declares that "Thinking is a kind of action, and reasoning is a kind of deliberate action; and to call an argument illogical, or a proposition false, is a special kind of moral judgment." And Peirce's more speculative writings contain suggestions to the effect that both logic and ethics are branches of aesthetics, and that the only thing properly regarded as good is the process of evolution, which Peirce seems to have thought is directed towards the perfection of reason.

Hence it falls to the Peirce scholar to try to sort out this mess of curious remarks, flippant dismissals, suggestions, and exaggerations into a coherent picture of normativity that complements the other, more thoroughly developed, aspects of Peirce's philosophy. There are many avenues worth exploring here, and, as I've mentioned, several of the chapters point to ways in which one might develop a Peircean theory of normativity.

That said, the book does exhibit a few flaws, some typical of a collection of expanded and polished conference papers, others,specific to this particular volume, so more lamentable. I begin with the former.

Volumes of this kind often suffer from various forms of unevenness across chapters. One has to do with the envisioned audience. Each contributor must decide for whom he or she is writing (fellow philosophers? fellow Peirce experts? budding pragmatists? ethicists?), and proceed accordingly. Even in cases where multiple authors envision a similar kind of readership, they can differ over the specifics of how that target audience is best addressed. Another kind of unevenness, which is no doubt related to the first, has to do with the degree of philosophical engagement. Each contributor must decide whether the aim is to simply describe his or her view, or argue for it, or defend it; and if the latter two, questions arise concerning the character of argument that is called for. For example: must I argue for my view by considering the philosophically best objections, or only the most popular or obvious ones? Or, more generally: how much philosophical common ground with my readers should I assume?

This book's chapters almost uniformly strike an uneasy posture that mixes textual exegesis (in some cases, bald reportage) with first-order philosophical argumentation. I call this pose uneasy in the current context because the exegetical passages (which in some chapters are rather long) indicate that the essays are meant to be read by those not yet familiar with Peirce's broader philosophy. This suggests that the contributors take themselves to be addressing a general audience of philosophers, not simply an audience of fellow Peirce experts (or fellow pragmatists). This, in turn, would seem to amplify the burdens with respect to the first-order philosophical argumentation that is presented. To wit: when you aspire to formulate, and perhaps even recommend, a Peircean conclusion to your fellow philosophers, it seems you should avoid assuming very much philosophical common ground. You must instead go into the trenches and talk about the issues, difficulties, and problems that motivate opposing philosophical programs, with an eye towards showing how the proposed Peircean alternative stacks up. Otherwise, you are merely preaching to the Peircean choir. Alas, the Peircean choir has no need for the extended exegetical discussions. While many of the chapters attempt to assess the comparative merits of Peirce's views with respect to current philosophical alternatives, only a few (most notably, Philstrom and Liszka) give non-Peircean ideas their due. Most frequently, Peirce is brought into contact only with severely underdeveloped and flimsy alternatives. That is to say, the stance taken on the issues of audience and engagement leaves the reader with a sense of disorientation: for what purpose were these essays written?

As I've mentioned, in collections devoted to specific topics and figures, this kind of disorientation is common and it might even be true to say inevitable. In light of this, one might conclude that unevenness is not an appropriate basis for criticism. But this particular volume has  an additional defect, one that rises to the level of a disappointment. To be blunt, so many of the chapters spend so much time reporting the intricate distinctions in Peirce's various attempts to develop a comprehensive classification of the sciences that there is entirely too little attention paid to the actual issues that drive normative theory as a field within our discipline. Accordingly, although there are several accounts of the various ways in which Peirce classified different kinds of normative inquiry, the reader doesn't get a good sense of where Peirceans should stand (or of the various places that they may stand) on the issues that are central to current moral philosophy. This is further complicated by the fact that some of the attempts to discuss the broader issues are clumsy and sometimes misleading. For example, in her otherwise interesting examination of Peirce's realism, Mayorga claims that "utilitarianism equates happiness (or goodness) with maximizing pleasure and minimizing pain for the majority" (124). Though this is intended merely as a gloss, no utilitarian would allow that characterization to stand. And in his searching overview of Peirce's views about ethics and moral reasoning, Liszka claims that "If Peirce suggests that all normative claims can be said to be true or false, that would make Peirce, not surprisingly, an ethical realist" (66). But this is to conflate cognitivism with realism.

More generally, this volume reflects an unfortunately missed opportunity. There are especially potent and influential strands of moral and meta-ethical theorizing afoot in contemporary philosophy that are arguably consonant with (and sometimes acknowledged as deriving from) Pericean-pragmatist sources. I think in particular of certain varieties of quasi-realism and constructivism. These views are of course importantly different from one another. But the "global" version of the former currently championed explicitly in the name of Peircean pragmatism by Huw Price is nowhere mentioned, let alone engaged. The same goes for both the Kantian (discourse-theoretic) and Humean (evolutionary) versions of constructivism in currency. The oversights are regrettable, as both the quasi-realist and constructivist programs are committed to a core anti-metaphysical thesis that was central to Peirce's own thinking, namely, that one can preserve the objectivity and truth-aptness of statements within a type of discourse without triggering metaphysical commitments to objects or entities that seemingly are referred to in those statements.

One can of course press a similar point with respect to current programs concerning other forms of normativity, especially aesthetic and epistemic. Here, too, there are influential movements within contemporary philosophy that are, broadly speaking, pragmatist. Yet these essays far too infrequently attempt to connect with them. An inevitable worry is that readers will get the sense that the community of Peirceans is fixated on Peirce's texts as its exclusive subject matter. And in any case the authors give very little guidance regarding how Peirce might be situated within the contemporary discussions of normativity. Given the extent of the untapped philosophical resources in Peirce, it is hard to imagine a more unwelcome result.