The Ontology of Psychology: Questioning Foundations in the Philosophy of Mind

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Linda A.W. Brakel, The Ontology of Psychology: Questioning Foundations in the Philosophy of Mind, Routledge, 2013, 179pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415635622.

Reviewed by Claudia Passos-Ferreira, Federal University of Rio de Janeiro


Linda Brakel presents an ambitious interdisciplinary approach to psychoanalysis. She focuses on three 'epistemological discomforts' in contemporary psychoanalysis. The first concerns techniques: how can we explain the effectiveness of psychoanalytic techniques in producing therapeutic changes? The second concerns ontology: what view of the mind-body problem is most appropriate in light of psychoanalysis? The third concerns methodology: what is the central role of consistency in psychoanalysis as well as in philosophy and science?

Chapters 2 through 4 each analyzes one of the three issues. Each chapter can be read alone. This might suggest that the book is not unified, that it lacks an explicit central thesis that integrates these issues into a coherent whole. However, there is an implicit thesis that unifies Brakel's analysis and integrates the three epistemological problems.

Brakel's core idea is that psychoanalytic theory is a general scientific theory of mind that might explain mental processes in general as well as particular pathological mental states. Brakel developed this thesis in previous books (Brakel 2009, 2010), and it is helpful to read this book keeping it in mind. As Brakel articulates it, the theory rests on three assumptions: psychological continuity, psychological determinism, and the existence of a dynamic unconscious. It postulates the existence of two types of mentation: the a-rational and associative primary process, and the rational and rule-following secondary process. It invokes free association as a methodological tool.

Brakel's project might be seen as part of the neuropsychoanalytical movement that aims to bring together psychoanalysis and a contemporary neuroscientific perspective on the mind. Historically, when opponents such as Adolf Grünbaum criticized the scientific status of psychoanalysis, an initial reaction was to construe psychoanalysis as an extension of common sense psychology, removing it from the realm of scientific theories. This approach can be found in psychoanalytic philosophers such as Richard Wollheim, Jonathan Lear, and Marcia Cavell. Brakel takes issue with these accounts of the mind. She aims to resume the naturalist project, putting psychoanalysis on the scientific agenda with an associated neurobiological ontology. She argues that psychoanalysis intervenes in the mind at a biological level, and she defends a reductive physicalist ontology of the mind in light of neuroscientific evidence about the dynamic biological unconscious.

In Chapter 2, Brakel defends a biological perspective on psychoanalytic techniques. She argues that classical techniques -- the use of the couch, frequent meetings, free association -- can produce more changes than rival psychotherapies because they are 'biologically potent'. By this she means that psychoanalytic techniques have the power to modify biological structures that play a crucial role in psychopathology.

Brakel's biological model is based on the biology of conditioning. The paradigmatic situation is the biological phenomena of aversive fear conditioning. It is an experimental fact that fear memory is easily acquired, readily generalized across contexts, and resistant to extinction. According to the research literature on conditioning, it is extremely difficult to destroy the original association of the conditioned stimulus and unconditioned stimulus even after intensive extinction training. Extinction of aversive conditioning is highly context-specific and "depends . . . on new learning that is specific to the context in which it is learned" (p. 22). The original association can recede only through the formation of new memories in a variety of contexts. Treatment for aversive fear, which plays a role in many neurotic psychopathologies, has shown better results when it includes multiple context exposure and imaginative rehearsal.

Brakel holds that classical psychoanalysis operates on both the psychological level and the biological level, whereas cognitive behavioral therapies operate primarily on the psychological level. Where the psychological level involves rationality-based learning and autobiographical memory, the biological level involves the dynamic unconscious and unconscious (irrational and a-rational) transferences. Brakel holds that this difference explains the positive outcomes of classic psychoanalytic techniques. Only these techniques can provide the multiple context exposure and imaginative rehearsal necessary for approximating extinction of aversively conditioned responses. The psychoanalytic setting -- with free association, frequency of meetings and the use of the couch -- creates a particular situation that facilitates the patient's imaginative engagement "toward the formation of multiple transference" (p. 29). Brakel emphatically defends the use of the couch as promoting the development of transferences through imagination. The couch "facilitates the shift from the real (here and now) to the imaginative" (p. 31). On her view these transferences are necessary for the enduring improvements in psychopathology provided by the biologically mediated process in which psychoanalysis intervenes.

Although she argues for extra-clinical testing for the psychoanalytical hypothesis, Brakel does not provide systematic empirical support for the effectiveness of the psychoanalytic techniques that she defends. The evidence of her findings is supported by here-and-now clinical ('on the couch') testability. She does not provide controlled experiments to test the psychoanalytical mechanism underlying therapeutic change. While this lack of support does not refute Brakel's view, it raises doubts about generalizing the hypothesis to a variety of cases and contexts. For instance, is the couch crucial for all cases or just for patients showing long-standing maladaptive patterns of behavior? Are free association and intensive relation with the analyst enough? Is psychoanalysis the best method for approximating extinction learning? Are classical psychoanalytic techniques the only way to intervene in basic biological processes? Because Brakel's hypotheses are theory-driven and remain to be empirically tested, they may not do much to persuade psychoanalysts who worry that classical techniques are not therapeutically beneficial.

Chapter 3, which is on the ontology of the mind, is the philosophical core of the book. Its main ambition is to provide a physicalist solution to the mind-body problem that might explain the unconscious mind and the psychological states found in clinical work. Brakel discusses a variety of metaphysical positions in the philosophy of mind. She rejects arguments for dualism, such as David Chalmers' conceivability argument, on the grounds that they fail to explain the causal efficacy of mental phenomena and that they have question-begging presuppositions (p. 47). She also rejects nonreductive views, such as Donald Davidson's anomalous monism (p. 53), which has had a strong impact in psychoanalysis, since these accounts fail to provide causal efficacy for mental events. She endorses reductive physicalism in the spirit of Jaegwon Kim (p. 71), arguing that it avoids many problems for nonreductive accounts, such as the ontological, epistemological and explanatory gaps, the mental causation problem, and the problem of causal exclusion.

Brakel develops her own version of reductive physicalism: Diachronic Conjunctive Token Physicalism. She holds that this view avoids problems for type physicalism (including multiple realization and scale problems) and better explains the correlations between a mental property and its realizing physical property. Brakel's main motivation for token physicalism is its compatibility with multiple realization phenomena and with scientific findings about brain plasticity (p. 81). Her model takes into account two ways of understanding token identities. Synchronically (at a specific time), a token mental state is identical with its physical token realizer. Diachronically (across time), a token mental state is a single unified entity constituted by the conjunction of various synchronic physical token realizers.

This model, Brakel suggests, helps to explain the biological ontology of the phobic fear states analyzed in Chapter 2. The patient's aversive conditioning consists of two sorts of ontological conjunctions: synchronically, the phobic fear state is constituted by the specific neuronal network realizer, and diachronically, it is constituted by the sum of many different instantiations of neuronal group realizers.

Brakel acknowledges that her contribution to the mind-body problem does not solve the problem of consciousness. Although she is convinced that her token physicalism closes the ontological gap (p. 81), she concedes that an identity theory cannot completely obviate the epistemic gap and fully explain all connections between physical events and their mental tokens. This raises the question of how she can confidently endorse reductive physicalism while the problem of consciousness remains unsolved. In light of the problem, Kim (2005) himself has rejected reductive physicalism where consciousness is concerned. Brakel does not make clear how her own view resolves this tension and how it accommodates the first-person experience of mental states -- an essential element in clinical work.

Chapter 4, "Uses and Abuses of Consistency", is the least straightforward part of the book. It investigates the role of consistency in four disciplines: thought experiments, empirical research, psychoanalysis and experimental philosophy. The basic idea is that human understanding is guided by consistency. Those domains of knowledge use consistency to achieve a common aim, which is to enlarge and advance current knowledge and our understanding of the world. Brakel's principal argument is that consistency is the criterion used to measure the advance of knowledge in those areas.

Brakel invokes a very broad and flexible notion of consistency here, to the point where one might wonder whether there is really a single notion at work. The key notion involves not just freedom from contradiction, but a sort of coherence: roughly, treating like cases alike. Brakel identifies cases in a number of fields where consistency in this sense is used and abused. In particular, she identifies a common case of abuse via 'false parallels' that arises especially in thought experiments and experimental philosophy. She proposes handling those cases by replacing the apparent parallels with intervening stepwise cases that are more deeply parallel and convergent to the original cases (p. 137).

In psychoanalysis, on Brakel's view, the role of consistency is to increase the understanding of a patient's mind. Psychoanalyst's interpretations work as a 'pilot experiment' that helps the analyst test her hypothesis and enlarge the patient's self-understanding of his behaviors as consistent and intelligible. Consistency across the patient's data is used to test the analyst's interpretations, rather than to test the general theory of mind postulated and subsumed in the interpretations.

Brakel's book offers a cogent and original defense of a biological ontology of the mind. Chapters 2 and 3, in which Brakel puts forward a novel explanation of the biological effectiveness of psychoanalysis and a novel way of placing the psychoanalytical mind in the physical world, are of particular interest.. Although there is much one can argue with, this is a refreshing reconceptualization of the psychoanalytic theory of mind.


Brakel, Linda A.W. (2009). Philosophy, Psychoanalysis and the A-rational Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Brakel, Linda A.W. (2010). Unconscious Knowing and Other Essays in Psycho-Philosophical Analysis. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Grünbaum, Adolph (1984). The Foundations of Psychoanalysis: A Philosophical Critique. Berkeley, CA: University of California Press.

Kim, Jaegwon (2005). Physicalism, or Something Near Enough. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.