The Order of Public Reason: A Theory of Freedom and Morality in a Diverse and Bounded World

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Gerald Gaus, The Order of Public Reason: A Theory of Freedom and Morality in a Diverse and Bounded World, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 621pp., $95.00 (hbk) ISBN 9780521868563.

Reviewed by Matthew Lister, University of Pennsylvania Law School


Gerald Gaus's book, The Order of Public Reason, is long, rich, and highly ambitious. It is also an important work, one that attempts both to give a rigorous account of the idea of public reason, developed out of an account of "social morality", and to show how, when the idea is properly understood, Classical Liberalism is the best way to structure a society where all are treated as free and equal. The Classical Liberalism that Gaus defends is an interesting and distinctive view, differing in important ways from both the "High Liberalism" of Rawls and those working in his wake, and from Libertarianism of the sort defended by Nozick, Rothbard, and others. While there are conservative elements to Gaus's approach, his is not a social conservative view, either. Classical Liberalism is not a new view, but Gaus has provided perhaps the most philosophically sophisticated justification for it.

This barely begins to touch on the many topics covered by Gaus along the way, including the relationship between reason and emotion in ethics, the role of instrumental reasoning in morality, the rationality and development of moral rules, the proper way to understand punishment and blame, and the place of history in morality, among others. I cannot hope to touch on all of these topics, even in a long review. I shall give an account of what I take to be the main thread of the argument, focusing on points of particular interest, and show where I think problems arise.[1]

Gaus's aim is to give an account of "social morality" that "reconciles freedom and the demands of public order in a society in which individuals, exercising their reason about the best thing to do, deeply disagree." (2) Social morality is not all of morality. Gaus explicitly excludes "visions of the good life and conceptions of virtue and vice" from it, (2-3) though it is not clear if this is all that is excluded. (Gaus often uses the term 'morality' without the modifier 'social' in a way that left me unclear if he meant morality in a broader sense or if he was merely being loose terminologically. I think we get a more plausible and coherent view if we take the second reading, so I will understand him to mean 'social morality' when he says 'morality' unless context tells clearly against this.) To understand social morality we must see that it has a point -- its task is to "allow us to live together in cooperative, mutually beneficial social relations." (4) But, while social morality has a point, it is not merely instrumentally valuable. Gaus argues that we have reasons to follow it even when it is not to our individual advantage. Social morality is imperative and prescriptive. It is about telling people what they must do. When we make a moral demand on someone, we make their actions "our business" and claim standing to tell others what they must do. Furthermore, it is people who claim this standing, not morality itself in some way. (9) If this authority is not to be mere authoritarianism, it must be justified. (6-13) This is the burden of the book. It is worth noting here that this project is much broader and more ambitious than Rawls's, as it is not limited to the basic structure of society, and in this way it has some similarity with G.A. Cohen's project, though of course Gaus follows through in a very different way.

Gaus spends the next 200 pages on the topic of "social order and social morality", providing insightful and interesting discussions of "instrumentalist" approaches to social order, an account of social morality as the "sphere of rules", and a discussion of the role of emotion and reason in social morality. The discussion is highly stimulating and interesting throughout, yet manages to maintain a highly accessible style. (Gaus's writing in general is conversational, unhurried, and pleasant to read.) The section on instrumental approaches, in particular, does a terrific job of presenting and critiquing game-theoretic approaches to morality, including a useful discussion of "revisionist" theories, such as Gauthier's "constrained maximization". This material may profitably be read on its own by those interested in the relevance of these approaches to moral and political philosophy. Proponents of particular views will find cause to object to some of Gaus's arguments, but I will merely note his conclusion.

While instrumentalist approaches have been very useful in showing us how and when a "system of restraint" is needed and the relationship of such a system to providing a "mutual beneficial social order", (100) Gaus claims that we cannot set up such a system, or show that such a system is justified, simply by means of an appeal to instrumental rationality. It is not the case, Gaus claims, that agents solely concerned with achieving their ends could use instrumental rationality alone to reach a stable solution to the problem that social morality is to solve. Revisionist theories do better, but at the cost of becoming implausible, and accounts that seem to work for small-scale interactions show little promise of "scaling up" to real, large and diverse, societies. To explain cooperation and the maintenance of a stable social order, we must turn to rule-based reasoning that cannot be reduced to mere instrumental reasoning.

Gaus is interested in moral rules that may be justified to "Members of the Public", or "MoPs" -- mildly idealized versions of real people who deliberate well and judge "only on the relevant and intelligible values, reasons, and concerns of the real agent she represents". (26) While there is no veil of ignorance in place during this reasoning, a MoP "always seeks to legislate impartially for all others Members of the Public." (26) For moral rules to be appropriately addressed to us, we must be moral agents with moral autonomy, including the ability to care for rules even when they do not promote our particular goals or ends, so long as we have sufficient reason to endorse the rule. (222) Taking others to meet this standard is an essential part of treating them as free and equal moral persons. (223)

This leads Gaus to what he terms the "Deliberative Public Justification Principle": L is a bona fide rule of social morality only if each and every Member of the Public endorses L as binding (and so to be internalized). (27) However, since we are in a state of evaluative diversity, the number of specific rules we will all ("each and every one of us") endorse will be limited. Gaus embraces this as a conclusion, with interesting and controversial results. We might think that we overcome this diversity by abstracting, an approach Gaus attributes to Kant and Rawls. But, Gaus claims, neither Kant's nor Rawls's approach allows us to converge on a determinate social morality; at least not once we step away from the process of abstraction and consider our actual desires.[2]

We face significant evaluative diversity on questions of social morality, but we need not throw up our hands in despair. While we are unlikely to converge on determinate rules, we are, Gaus holds, likely to agree on a range of rules that are reasonable. (That is, for each "issue", there will be a range of reasonable rules.) This set of reasonable rules forms a set of "optimal eligible proposals". While MoPs differ on their ranking of rules within the set, all agree that any member is better than having no rule at all.

Rules of a special sort, "moral social rules", are necessary for social life, given that instrumental reasoning alone won't solve the problem of stable cooperation. But rules have seemed mysterious to many, motivating the instrumentalist arguments that Gaus thinks have failed. In place of the instrumentalist boot-strapping approach, Gaus offers an evolutionary account of rules, arguing that, through processes of cultural-biological co-evolution, humans were able to form societies of "rule-following punishers" -- individuals who follow rules unconditionally and punish those who do not. Such a group can realize the cooperative benefits of rule-following, but unlike a society of "unconditional rule-followers" it is not open to easy invasion by defectors. (106-8) The model is complex and depends on certain assumptions about favorable conditions, but it at least allows us to see how rule-following could develop without instrumentalist boot-strapping. I am less persuaded that this account supports Gaus's important claim that his approach provides strong evidence that "rules" (individual rules) and not "abstract principles" (as "some argue") are the "units of justification" for social morality. (113) It is not clear why an account that took principles to be basic, and rules to be necessary specifications of them, could not also account for the relevant facts. No one, after all, denies that rules must be justified, or that we must (usually) specify abstract principles before applying them. (Perhaps this is why the "some" above go unnamed.)

A further notable aspect of Gaus's account of rules that strongly resonates with his evolutionary account is that the rules in which we are interested in social morality are the rules that we actually have. The account starts from and works with current "positive morality" (in a sense similar to that used by H.L.A. Hart.[3]) Not all "positive moralities" (or all parts of any positive morality) stand up to the requirements of being part of "true morality" -- certain standards of impartiality and mutual acceptability, at least, must apply for that -- but this is compatible with there being several, not fully over-lapping, "true" moralities. I would add a point that Gaus does not stress: that "critical morality", in Hart's sense -- the moral evaluation of existing moral, political, and legal institutions -- is itself part of the positive morality of any society of free and equal persons. This sort of pluralism is related to another important aspect of Gaus's account, the path-dependence of morality. The problem of crafting a justified social morality may be solved in different ways, and the causes of a society converging on a particular solution may have no moral importance on their own. While the causes of a society having a particular social morality may be largely morally arbitrary, this does not mean the actual social morality is not morally authoritative and binding on us.

In the second half of the book Gaus turns to the "Problem of Public Reason", identified as the question, "How can we identify social demands that all have sufficient reason to acknowledge as moral demands?" (262) Gaus hopes to establish a system that is more "realistic" than other approaches. The results are novel and worthy of careful study. I cannot hope to give sufficient attention to all aspects of the account, but will give an overview of his procedures and look at three particular aspects in slightly more detail: his account of "jurisdictional rights", his defense of private property and rejection of socialism, and the relationship between his classical liberalism and democracy.

Gaus starts with what he calls the "Basic Principle of Public Justification" ("BPPJ"). It states:

A moral imperative "Ф!" in context C, based on rule L, is an authoritative requirement of social morality only if each normal moral agent has sufficient reason to (a) internalize rule L, (b) hold that L requires Ф-type acts in circumstances C and (c) moral agents generally conform to L. (263)

To tell whether a particular moral imperative is compatible with the BPPJ, we build a deliberative model to test the rule. On this account, the unit of evaluation is always individual rules. Possible rules are proposed by MoPs and judged against each other in pair-wise comparisons. Gaus stresses that the goal of the deliberative model is not to give a theory of wrongness or to produce a general theory of justice. (276) Rather, it is a means to test whether particular rules of social morality are publicly justifiable or not. When MoPs evaluate proposed rules, they do so with a wide variety of evaluative standards, including their diverse values, ends, and goals. (277) Even when these are shared, they will often be weighed in different ways by different MoPs. Anything that could give a MoP a reason to endorse one proposed rule over another serves as an evaluative standard. (278) Gaus limits the diversity here with a requirement that evaluative standards must be "mutually intelligible" to fellow MoPs, though he rejects calls for stronger "shared reason" requirements. (281)

Not all proposals by MoPs can qualify as moral rules. Gaus accepts several constraints on proposed rules, including a "generality" requirement (294-5) and a "weak publicity condition", holding that rules must be knowable and understandable by all MoPs.[4] (296) Proposed rules must help avoid conflict and must be seen as requirements, providing weighty reasons for action, not just advice. (298) More substantively, Gaus holds that rules must be "universalizable" in the sense of "reversible". Advocacy of a rule must not depend on knowing one will be in a privileged position. (300) This is a modest form of universalizability in that it does not require considering if the rule would be acceptable if the proposer had different evaluative standards than she does. (301) In this weaker standard, we see the grounds for an important difference between Gaus and Rawls on stability under full justification. Rawls holds that the abstraction and reflection process will often bring about normative shifts in individuals, while Gaus seems to reject this, characterizing it (wrongly, I think) as an objectionable compromising of principles. (505) Finally, Gaus includes a "modest common good" requirement. Proposals must not threaten the good of any MoP, where this includes, at least, "protection of bodily integrity, basic liberties to make her decisions about most of the important aspects of her life, control over basic resources needed to live a life, and so on." (303)

By a process of pair-wise comparisons, MoPs construct an ordinal ranking of proposals that meet certain formal conditions. (305) As is well known, certain important technical problems arise in trying to construct such a system, especially when preferences are incomplete. Gaus's treatment of this matter is interesting and useful, but I shall not discuss it. The important point is that different MoPs will emerge with different rankings of proposals and so will in many instances have different ideas as to what constitutes the optimal rule. In some cases MoPs will reject proposed rules because they fail to meet the noted standards, showing the proposed rule to be generally unacceptable. In other cases a MoP will hold that no rule is needed or desirable for a certain area of life -- that these areas are "no one's business". Gaus holds that we should take this sort of "blameless liberty" as the default; for any area, the claim that a social moral rule is needed must be justified, while the absence of a rule needs no special justification. Once we have eliminated all the "ineligible" rules, the rules that are left in all MoP's eligible sets form a "socially eligible set" of rules. Any rule in the set will be preferable to all MoPs to a state of blameless liberty on a topic, and so all have reason to endorse a rule from this set as authoritative. The Pareto rule may further help narrow the set. If a rule X is preferred to rule Y by everyone, then Y is eliminated from the set, leaving us with a "socially optimal set" of moral rules. (323)

Where blameless liberty is preferred, the set will be empty. In a few cases the socially optimal set may converge on one rule- a single member that all agree to. But this leaves many cases where we are left with a large number of eligible rules. Our question now is how to choose from among the socially optimal set, given that MoPs will prefer any member of this set to no rule. An obvious answer would be to appeal to democratic decision-making, or to bargaining theory. Neither, at least in general, is Gaus's answer. One reason for this is that there are many possible ways to set up such procedures, and MoPs will disagree as to which is the best. (328) Given other conclusions that Gaus will draw later, I am not sure that he is justified in inferring from this that we ought not appeal to democratic choice. I leave this aside for now. So, we must look further to eliminate diversity among socially optimal eligible rules. We do this via arguments from abstraction and claims about agency.

A common procedure when faced with a diversity of ends and values and the need to fix a rule is to abstract away from our particular point of view and to reason from a shared perspective. For such an approach to be successful, Gaus claims, we must find a shared perspective that allows us to identify particular important standards, and the results must be "fully justified" when we consider our ends and values at the conclusion of the abstraction process. (335-6) Gaus argues that the "perspective of agency" fills this role. From this perspective, MoPs will endorse a "presumption in favor of liberty": (1) agents are under no standing moral obligation (in social morality) to justify their choices to others; (2) it is wrong to exercise one's liberty so as to interfere with, block, or thwart the agency of another without justification. (341) This does not imply a perfectionist ideal of personal autonomy, but only a minimal condition of self-directed agency.

From here Gaus considers the right to not be coerced and deceived. (349) Coercion is a notoriously vague idea, in part because some supposed instances of it assume the existence of rights that may not yet be established. (351) In particular, at this stage we have not established property rights, so any account of coercion we give here cannot appeal to them. However, threats against one's natural person seem clear enough cases even at this stage of abstraction, and we may similarly see deception as an analogous attempt to subvert our agency. To this extent, we may agree on a right against coercion, though it may expand as other rights are recognized. (352) Gaus next argues that we would accept freedom of thought, including free speech and freedom of conscience. From the perspective of agency, Gaus claims, MoPs will endorse a fairly strong right to well-being or resources, as they will insist not only on the freedom to pursue their goals, but also on the means to do so. (359) However, Gaus holds that such rights are not stable under full justification, since they will clash with the evaluative standards of some MoPs. For example, those favoring a strong principle of desert will reject giving aid to the "undeserving". (363) Weak duties of assistance might survive full justification, but strong ones, Gaus argues, will not. More substantive welfare provisions might be justified in other ways, but are not required, Gaus claims, by the method of abstraction to the perspective of agency. (367-8)

Gaus next turns to what he calls "Jurisdictional Rights". (372) His goal is not to give a "theory" of rights, but to highlight an important function rights can play: distinguishing an "individualized sphere of moral authority in which the right-holder's judgment about what is to be done provides others with a moral reason to act." (373) Gaus considers rights to private property, privacy, and freedom of association, though there is no reason to think that this is a complete list. This is one of the most interesting sections of the book, one ripe for further development and investigation, perhaps especially from legal and constitutional theorists seeking to bring clarity to the seeming hodgepodge of ideas that have been gathered under a constitutional right to privacy. Jurisdictional rights provide answers to some of the problems arising from evaluative pluralism. We do this by "devolving" moral authority to individuals within a specific sphere. Within that sphere, the evaluative standards of the individual will control. (That is, at least within the bounds of basic rights, I assume, though Gaus does not stress this.)

Consider privacy. Legal scholars have struggled to understand how items grouped under this right -- from the right to have an abortion to the right against searches without a warrant -- fit together. Gaus's jurisdictional approach offers a path. We might think that there is a sphere (or spheres) of life that is "no one's business". Granting a jurisdictional right to privacy in such cases would not only mean that individuals could decide what happens in those areas, but also when and whether this becomes public. Private property also establishes a jurisdictional right. This is another sphere where, within limits (hardly discussed by Gaus) individuals are best left to decide how to set rules. A certain amount of private property seems necessary if we are to be agents at all. Without, at least, control over one's personal effects, it would be hard to function as an agent. Furthermore, property of various sorts is an essential means by which many people seek to promote their diverse ends. Allowing individuals to have control over property, therefore, may be essential to agency. Gaus argues that MoPs will endorse fairly strong notions of private property, accepting that property rights are not easily over-ruled and that a wide variety of property may be owned. The argument at this point is under-developed, but not implausible. However, from this Gaus attempts to derive an argument (the first of two) against socialism in any form. I shall consider both arguments together later in this review. With regard to both privacy and private property, Gaus's approach provides fertile ground for further development and investigation.

We next face the problem of how to move from abstract principles to concrete social order, as well as how to solve the problem of indeterminacy in areas not directly addressed by abstract principles. We again have MoPs propose rules consistent with our abstract principles and rank them. In many cases, we will be left with a non-empty, but non-singleton set. (391) Gaus again insists that, because there is no optimal aggregative method, we cannot agree on any principle of decision to solve this problem. (391-2) But, he says, this is only a problem if we think that the process for picking among the optimal eligible set must itself be uniquely publicly justified. While this might seem obvious, Gaus holds that it is misguided. Gaus calls his solution to the problem the "Kantian coordination game". This is a model in which there are positive returns on coordinating on a rule followed by others. This can result from random facts about the distribution of rules in a group. In a fairly short period of time all may coordinate on a rule even if their original preference was for some other rule, without any explicit decision procedure guiding them. Here a process (random chance and then coordination) that was not uniquely justified may lead to a unique solution. (397) Many question about the realism and applicability of the model arise here, but I want to raise a different question, one related to my worry about the bias against democratic decision-making in Gaus's account.

Gaus argued that political decision-making is problematic because no aggregative procedure is uniquely justifiable, and different MoPs will prefer different procedures. But he also argued that methods for coordinating on rules may produce justified rules even if the method is not itself uniquely justified, and that rules that were the result of historically contingent facts or processes may become justified via a process of selection and coordination. But why should this apply only to individual rules and not also to methods of political decision-making? While no such procedure is uniquely correct or preferable, it is not clear why we may not, via the same sort of argument that we applied to rules, select a democratic decision procedure. Given that there will often be large advantages to having such a procedure, I see no compelling argument against it. History may be justificatory for choice procedures just as much as for rules.

In the final section of the book, Gaus turns to the relationship between the "moral and political orders", discussing the nature of the authority of the state, private property and redistribution, and the provision of public goods. I will focus primarily on the first two items, and especially on the discussion of private property. Gaus accepts that, at least on some understandings, the state has political authority; it may use justified coercion against its own citizens to enforce its laws (463) and it may create new duties and rights where none existed. In the first case Gaus's distinctive contribution is to argue that, given that the right to be free of coercion is a real right and not merely a goal, the state may not use coercion merely to reduce coercion elsewhere in the system. While the state has the authority to use coercion, each use must be justified on its own. The state may also use its authority to create new rights and duties. This is more than merely facilitating coordination on a norm. In some cases state action creates new rights and duties where none existed before. Complex property relations are a clear example. (466-7) Gaus rejects, however, a third interpretation, that the state has a "right to rule", in the sense that we have a duty to the state to do what it says. (468) Rather, the duties we have are to our fellow citizens, not to "the state" or its agents.

I now return to Gaus's argument against socialism and in favor of strong private property rights, begun during his discussion of jurisdictional rights and continued here. We assume that some system of property rights is needed for agency, but which sort is yet unclear. Furthermore, property rights, even more than others, depend on the state for their definition. This suggests that strong natural rights views of property are implausible. (509) But that property rights are highly conventional does not mean that just any system will do. (510)

Gaus's argument against socialism is, I think, compelling against some forms of it. Unfortunately, he stunningly fails to engage with the actual positions of Rawls or other proponents of liberal market socialism in a way that is so blatant that it is hard to know if he has made any effort to even know what their positions are. Consider Gaus's argument against Rawls's claim that liberal socialism may be compatible with Rawls's two principles of justice. Gaus attempted to dismiss this in his discussion of jurisdictional rights, claiming that it would not give people sufficient grounds to develop their ideas of a good life. In so arguing, Gaus claimed that, under Rawls's market socialist view, private property would be limited to "personal property", meaning "consumer goods but not … residences or buildings." (378) This is flatly contradicted by Rawls, who says that acceptable private property under liberal socialism would "include at least certain forms of real property, such as dwellings and private grounds."[5]

It is already clear that Gaus is arguing against a straw-man here. This is further apparent when we look at the much more developed market socialist positions presented (historically) by Eduard Bernstein, or by Alec Nove or John Roemer more recently.[6] In all of these cases there is no a priori limit on the sorts of property that may be privately held, but all include private dwellings and small businesses within the clearly permitted range, and all insist that even major industries need not be state-owned. Gaus does not consider any of these well-known works, but the argument from jurisdictional rights cannot, as-is, rule these systems out.

In his second argument, Gaus points out that if a system of property rights has strong positive or negative effects on other important rights, this would be a good reason to favor or disfavor the system of property rights. He notes that officially socialist countries have done quite poorly on protecting civil rights, while more "liberal" societies have done better, and concludes that this is a compelling argument against socialism. (513-5)This is a powerful reply against the establishment of one-party or dictatorial states. However, those were already not under consideration. Rawls, Bernstein, Nove, and Roemer have all advocated for liberal market socialism. Rawls is explicit that any such system must be compatible with his first principle of justice, and Bernstein pointed out, more than one hundred years ago, that, "for Social Democracy, the defence of civil liberties has always taken precedence over the fulfillment of any economic postulate."[7] Gaus may hold that these are merely speculative cases, and that we have no reason to think that market socialism is in fact compatible with liberalism. (515-6) But this is either unconvincing -- we would need much more of an argument than we have -- or, arguably, false. The Nordic countries -- especially Sweden and Denmark -- enacted social, political, and property systems, by democratic means, very heavily based on the system and approach sketched by Bernstein,[8] and yet were and are free, happy, and prosperous societies (as is shown by the very evidence Gaus cites.) Gaus may want to claim that such social democracies are not truly socialist, but then we are reduced to a verbal dispute. Gaus's argument against socialism can, at best, establish significantly less than he claims, largely ruling out societies that essentially no one today supports anyway.

Gaus concludes this section with an interesting and challenging account of when state action in the provision of "public goods" is appropriate. There is significant material that will spark future debate, though I lack room to consider it. The book ends with a sermon encouraging us all to support justified moral orders and not to undermine them by insisting that they must be fully just by our own standards to have moral authority. This is a worthy point, but seems to me to misunderstand the role of critical moral and political philosophy.

Gaus's book is highly complex and stimulating, covering a daunting range of topics. It provides, I believe, the most complete and rigorous defense of classical liberalism available to date, and will certainly spark an industry of debate, elaboration, and discussion. It deserves to do so. I have been able to touch on only a small number of the interesting topics in the book and to note only a few of my disagreements. I learned from nearly every page. It would be an excellent book to anchor a graduate seminar in moral or political philosophy, except for its exorbitant price of $95.00. Additionally, the copy-editing is very bad, as the book has a large number of typos. For the price we should at least be able to have competent and careful copy-editing. We should hope that Cambridge University Press will see well to bring out a more reasonably priced and better edited version of this important book soon.

[1] The book has already been the subject of an extremely interesting discussion group on the "Public Reason" weblog. I benefited greatly from the discussion and commend it to others.

[2] Gaus often makes use of historical figures as stock stand-ins for positions he wants to argue against. This is fine, even if it will annoy historians. Though it draws on a large number of historical figures, this is not a work of historical scholarship. But many, perhaps all, of these figures were addressing problems importantly different from the one Gaus is interested in, so it is no surprise they did not answer his question in a fully satisfying way. (For example, it is surprising to see the author of the Letter Concerning Toleration made to stand for the position that, "the only resolution of the clash of private judgments about morality is a procedural-political resolution, which creates an umpire who is the voice of public reason.") (24) Similarly, no attention is paid to the way Rawls proposes to specify moral principles via his four-state process. As one important difference between Gaus and Rawls is how much each thinks should be left to the democratic process, this is a significant omission.

[3] H.L.A. Hart, Law, Liberty, and Morality, p. 20.

[4] Large parts of the law in the U.S. likely do not meet this requirement if we take "understandable" to mean "able to be taught to children", as Gaus suggests. This may be a mark against the law, or against this way of understanding publicity. I lean towards the latter.

[5] Rawls, Justice as Fairness, p. 114, fn36.

[6] See, respectively, Eduard Bernstein, The Preconditions of Socialism, Alec Nove, The Economics of Feasible Socialism, and John Roemer, A Future for Socialism.

[7] See, respectively, Rawls, Justice as Fairness, pp. 137-8, and Bernstein, The Preconditions of Socialism, p. 147.

[8] On this point, see Sheri Berman, The Primacy of Politics: Social Democracy and the Making of Europe's Twentieth Century.