The Origins of Responsibility

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François Raffoul, The Origins of Responsibility, Indiana University Press, 2010, 341pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780253221735.

Reviewed by Keith Ansell-Pearson, University of Warwick


In this book Fran├žois Raffoul seeks to undertake a major reconsideration of the concept of responsibility, drawing upon the rich resources offered by trajectories in continental thought, notably Nietzsche, Sartre, Heidegger, Levinas, and Derrida. His fundamental contention is that we need to think responsibility less in terms of denoting a sphere of power and control, revolving around the establishment of a sovereign subject, and more in terms of our exposure to an event that does not emanate from us but which does call us. According to Raffoul we need to think responsibility not in terms of a spontaneous initiation but rather as a response. This suggests to him that the phenomenological senses of responsibility are closer to a problematic of answerability than to one of accountability and the latter's dependence on a 'metaphysical' conception of the subject. As such, the argument represents what is now a familiar set of moves within continental philosophy, namely, dethroning the imperial claims of a philosophy of the subject and replacing this with a thinking of the event. However, the chief danger of such a move is that it runs the risk of instituting a new set of oppositions -- for example, between activity and passivity, between control and letting be, etc. -- and becomes blind to those situations where sovereign subjects might be needed in order to assume power and exercise control. I am not convinced that sovereignty can be so easily dispensed with, and in some cases in this study, Nietzsche for example (the philosopher of will to power!), the argument seems far-fetched and over-determined.

The book is highly challenging. One of the main challenges consists in Raffoul's insistence that a fundamental rethinking of the question at hand, the nature and status of responsibility, needs to take place outside of the terms of familiar debates in moral philosophy, such as that between the competing claims of free will and determinism and the identification of responsibility with the sphere of the voluntary. Instead, Raffoul favours a phenomenological approach in which the terms of major debates within ethics prove themselves to be inadequate. Furthermore, the opposition between free will and determinism remains caught up in metaphysics and is merely an 'ontical' distinction and thus an obstacle to a proper ontological inquiry (concerned with the phenomenological 'being' of responsibility). The key claim of the book, then, is that, as classically and typically understood, responsibility is wedded to a questionable metaphysics of the free and autonomous subject and we need to start to think the possibilities of a responsibility without reference to such a subject. For Raffoul, the way forward lies in opening up, with the aid of his chosen continental thinkers, the senses of the Latin 'respondere', meaning responsiveness and answerability. The focus is to switch attention away from the subject that creates ethics for itself to an examination of the nature of the ethical claims that call us.

The book is divided into eight chapters. After a lengthy and helpful Introduction, Raffoul deals in turn with Aristotle and Kant. Here the aim is to reconstitute the accounts of accountability and agency we find in two founding figures in the history of ethics. These two chapters enable Raffoul to explore how the concept of responsibility has been shaped by notions of will, causality, freedom of will, authorship, and subjectivity. In the case of Kant we see clearly the effort to ground responsibility in a metaphysics of the subject where the subject is conceived in terms of free, spontaneous agency: the ground of ethics resides in a 'subjectum' that is causally foundational and an absolute beginning. This tradition is then placed under critical scrutiny beginning with chapter three on Nietzsche, where the focus is on Nietzsche's 'genealogy' of responsibility and alleged deconstruction of accountability. According to Raffoul, it is Nietzsche who exposes the extent to which the traditional concept of responsibility rests on certain fictions, for example, those of agency, causality, free will, intentionality. Here the effort is one of demystification in which it is shown that there is not a 'natural' concept of responsibility simply because our conceptuality of it, or our very thinking of it, is bound up with metaphors and arbitrary designations. In short, responsibility must be given a history and shown to be a construct. Ultimately, the aim of a genealogy of responsibility is to show how the history of the subject has taken place in terms of creating a subject bound up with guilt. Nietzsche is important to Raffoul's project because he opens up, with his doctrine on the 'innocence of becoming', a space where a new sense of responsibility can be thought.

Initially, we can think this new sense in terms of the 'groundlessness' of existence (the death of God and the release from theological principles and precepts). In chapter four, Raffoul explores how Sartre provides an account of the phenomenological and ontological origins of responsibility. Here he follows a familiar route by showing the sources of Sartrean existentialism in Nietzsche's report on the death of God. However, he also comes up with fresh and novel insights into Sartre's upholding of radical freedom and the famous dictum of existentialism that 'existence precedes essence'. Perhaps the most important insight is that it is through the withdrawal of essence from existence that, paradoxically, existence can become a new site of responsibility. Here responsibility becomes original and ontological: 'responsibility for Sartre is an originary praxis that is justified by itself alone' (p. 29). It is, then, from the very lack of God-given or a priori norms that our ethical responsibility arises in the first place. But surely, one might object, isn't Sartre's philosophy of freedom one that grants absurd and unrealistic degrees of agency and power to subjects? Isn't his philosophy ultimately one of 'egology'? Raffoul concedes these points, noting an 'undeconstructed Cartesianism' at the very heart of Sartre's philosophy of responsibility. It is because of this that a move beyond Sartre is necessitated and this occupies Raffoul's attention in chapter five, which is focused, unsurprisingly, on the work of Levinas.

It is Levinas, of course, who overturns the tradition of responsibility by according primacy to passivity over mastery and intentionality, instituting a series of moves, 'from ego to the other, from freedom to subjection, from the spontaneous will to the accusation and persecution of the self' (p. 31). In short, Levinas initiates a revolution in our thinking of responsibility simply because his focus is not on responsibility for oneself but one that comes from and is centred upon the other. This could not be more different than the philosophy of 'egology' of Sartre and a great deal of moral thinking. Moreover, as Raffoul notes, in Levinas responsibility is not to be thought in terms of its relation to abstract categories such as universal reason, but rather 'face to face' in the relationship to the other human and involves a devotion to her vulnerability and mortality. We don't bow down before the law but before another human being whose fragility calls out to us and demands work from us. However, Raffoul argues that Levinas's ethics amounts to an over-reaction to the tradition and ends up simply reversing it. He asks the pertinent question: is reversing the tradition the same as freeing oneself from it? That Levinas's thought is structured in such terms is readily apparent to anyone who has encountered it: the subject is no longer a for-itself but a for-the-other; the self is not a freedom but a passivity; the self does not posit and determine meaning for itself but is affected and exposed by the other, and so on. In a move that may surprise many readers, Raffoul proposes we turn to Heidegger in order to begin to think outside egology and its reversal. This is what occupies his attention in chapters six and seven. The move may come as a surprise because for many working within the continental tradition it is the turn to Levinas, over and against Heidegger, that is needed in order to adequately think ethics.

Heidegger is important and occupies a pivotal role in this study because he provides the resources for a rich ontological understanding of responsibility for which ethics can be thought in terms of being and its event. It is in Heidegger that we find radically new conceptions of what being responsible means, such as the facticity of responsibility, the call of conscience and being-guilty, the assumption of finitude, an exposure to an inappropriable event, and so on. In short, we have an 'originary ethics' that is first and foremost a thinking of being and not a thinking of the subject in terms of the classical repertoire of concepts such as agency, will, and subjectivity. In Heidegger we find, as Raffoul puts it, the 'ethicality' of being itself in which being is to be conceived not as a substantial ground but as an event that calls for responsible engagement and praxis.

It is in these chapters that Raffoul carries out some of the most original work in the book, showing the extent to which Heidegger is indeed a major thinker of a renewed sense of responsibility. He locates this in the very structure or being of Dasein itself which, he maintains, needs to be understood as an 'archi-ethical' notion and in which ethical responsibility is thought in terms that are very different to the way it is conceived in the classical conception of a free, autonomous subject. Here responsibility is not conceived 'as imputability of the free subject, but is instead approached in terms of a response to an event that is also a call', such as the call of conscience (p. 35). This means that there is a care of self in Heidegger, as one might put it, that is having to be true to oneself, but this is to be thought as a 'response' to a call within being itself and qua the 'event' of being. In the final chapter, using Derrida's work, Raffoul explores further the aporias of responsibility, e.g., the experience of the 'impossible' in which there is a duty beyond duty and in order for there to be a genuine decision it is important that I must not know what to do. This is another strong and highly instructive chapter.

I have learned a great deal from this book. However, there are lacunae within the project as it is laid out, and one may wish to question some of Raffoul's decisions with respect to his coverage of authors. At the very outset he states that his purpose here is to 'reengage the question of responsibility as it is elaborated in post-Nietzschean continental thought' in an effort to explore its post-metaphysical, phenomenological, and ontological senses, as a way of moving our thinking of responsibility away from its compulsive attachment to the traditional interpretation as the accountability of a free and autonomous subject. However, one might question the wisdom of anchoring the study in terms of 'post-Nietzschean' thought. It is not that Nietzsche is not important or significant (far from it!), but to make him the centrepiece in the turning of thought that is held to be required is to exaggerate his significance at the expense of other pivotal figures one might draw upon to support the aims of the research. I am thinking here in particular of Bergson and his analysis of the dual sources of morality, including his extraordinary treatment of the 'open soul' and dynamic morality in his neglected Two Sources of Morality and Religion. It is arguable that seminal strands of continental philosophy -- for example, the work of Levinas and possibly even Derrida -- take their cue, consciously or not, from Bergson as much as, if not more than, they do from Nietzsche.

As it is, in this study Nietzsche plays a familiar fashionable role as an 'agent' of deconstruction. The reading of Nietzsche, whilst strong in some aspects, is the weakest in the book. In my view Raffoul fails to develop an adequate appreciation of Nietzsche on the sovereign individual and the importance of sovereignty in his work. For a start he lumps together middle period and late period 'Nietzsches', failing to see the extent to which Nietzsche's commitment to non-accountability and 'irresponsibility' in 1878 (the time of Human, All Too Human) is largely the result of a set of metaphysical commitments he has at this time, such as his commitment to determinism, and is largely inspired by, in my view, an adolescently held Laplacean physics of the universe (in which all is pre-determined and there is nothing new under the sun). Second, he fails to appreciate the reasons why Nietzsche, for all his deconstruction of the subject and of agency, ends up affirming the need for sovereignty and the attainment of power over oneself, which for him is largely a necessity of culture and cultivation (including 'breeding'). It is quite clear, I would argue, that Nietzsche sets up the figure of the supra-ethical sovereign individual largely as a response to what he sees as the anemic ideals of agency and selfhood on offer within what he takes to be decadent modernity. For him the desire to be outside oneself and to lose oneself -- even in another -- is the desire of someone who is weak and self-discontented. There is a need, as Nietzsche sees it, for the self to be adventurous and experimental (even destructive toward oneself), with no beautiful soul twaddle. So much of Nietzsche's late thinking, then, is designed to give us decadent moderns insight into a more robust ideal. Ultimately, Nietzsche occupies a paradoxical place in the history of responsibility the book traces and Raffoul doesn't quite know what to do with him: 'One the one hand, he accomplishes a destruction of that tradition, yet on the other hand, one cannot but note how certain features of that tradition, such as the very motif of power, of legislation and self-legislation, are brought to a paroxysm' (p. 120).

In addition I would point out two significant omissions in Raffoul's coverage: the first is any treatment of the work of Foucault, which is surely crucial to a proper appreciation of turns in ethics in post-Nietzschean continental thought (and for Foucault, we can note, there is no sovereign, founding subject and no universal form of the subject to be found anywhere). The second omission is recognition of the importance of the work of Alain Badiou, which is surely relevant to the concerns of this book, with its criticism of Levinasian-inspired ethics and where we have an ethics of the subject founded on a thinking of the event but which is very different -- so it would appear -- to what we encounter in Heidegger. All of this would, in my view, have been worth exploring.

Having made these criticisms let me conclude by giving the book a strong recommendation. Raffoul displays throughout considerable skills of reading and exegesis, and he has an important story to tell about the history of responsibility. It will be of tremendous interest to anyone working in ethics, especially from within the continental tradition. Rather than provide a normative ethics Raffoul shows the need, first of all, to inquire into the meaning of ethics or what he calls the ethicality of ethics. He shows that the tradition of continental philosophy, notably in the form of phenomenology, has important resources for demonstrating this. There is a great deal to admire in this book and one can only look forward to Raffoul's future work.