While literary scholars and historians have long paid attention to the Port-Royal nuns, Anglophone philosophers have largely seen their role as a supporting cast for Antoine Arnauld and Blaise Pascal -- if not overlooking their contributions altogether. In the past decade, only two book-length studies touch on the convent's philosophies: John J. Conley's study of three Arnauld sisters, Adoration and Annihilation: The Convent Philosophy of Port-Royal (University of Notre Dame Press, 2009), and Daniella Kostroun's Feminism, Absolutism, and Jansenism (Cambridge, 2011). Beyond this, other than Conley's reader of Jacqueline Pascal's work (A Rule for Children and Other Writings, University of Chicago Press, 2003) and a recent article, little philosophical literature on these women exists in English. So Conley's monograph on the Pascal women is a welcome and timely contribution to the literature.
The book is organized into five chapters, with each of the middle three chapters dedicated to one of the Pascal women: Jacqueline Pascal, Gilberte Pascal Périer, and Marguerite Périer. The introduction provides biographical information about the Pascal family: Étienne Pascal and his children Jacqueline, Blaise, and Gilberte, as well as Gilberte's daughter Marguerite. After the death of Étienne's wife, Antoinette, he personally educated his children with the help of Gilberte; eventually their entire family converted to Jansenism. The introduction also describes these women's philosophy as gendered: their philosophies are written as an expression of their place as Jansenist women in seventeenth-century Paris; were they not women, their ideas would look very different (to our loss).
Each of the middle three chapters has a similar arrangement, a chapter introduction, a biography of some depth, and a historical account of each woman's written works. This is followed by subsections outlining the content of the works organized by the themes they address. Each chapter concludes with the thinker's philosophical contributions. The final chapter concisely summarizes biographical information, philosophical contributions, and also contains Conley's ultimate defense of early modern women as philosophers. The book also has an Appendix that is a highlight of the book, as it contains translations of work by each woman.
A significant shortcoming of the book's organization is the repetitiveness: while each chapter standing on its own is an advantage, the relative cost is too high. The Pascal family biography is articulated in every chapter, often with only modest additions. Even within each chapter it is repeated through the chapter divisions outlined above. For example, by the time the reader has finished this book, she has read about the crisis of the signature at least nine separate times, often with little addition between each telling. Consolidating this information into one family biography, perhaps serving as the first chapter, would make for a more engaging read, and allow space for deeper analysis of each philosopher.
In the second chapter, Jacqueline Pascal is portrayed as a philosopher and poet who wrote on education, apophatic theology, and virtue, combining moral rigorism with an Augustinian virtue ethics. A celebrated poet in her childhood, most of Jacqueline's philosophical contributions revolve around her joining the Port-Royal community and the controversies that followed -- the dowry controversy where she aimed, to the dismay of her siblings, to donate her share of their father's inheritance to Port-Royal, as well as the formulary crisis (the crisis of the signature), where Jacqueline lead her fellow nuns in resistance to both Rome (who demanded they renounce their Jansenist commitments) and the theologians at Port-Royal (who, under Arnauld, encouraged the nuns to sign the formulary while rejecting the spirit of it through a sophism).
For each of these events, Conley offers a detailed and engaging account that sets the stage for Jacqueline's philosophy, which he divides into themes of divine hiddenness (The Mystery and the Death of Our Lord Jesus Christ, 1651), pedagogy and virtue (A Rule for Children, 1665), vocational freedom (Report to Mother Prioress, 1653), and conscience and gender (a philosophy of praxis that emerges from the formulary controversy). Conley successfully sets Jacqueline apart as a gifted thinker and activist in her own right, not a chronicler whose relevance only exists in the shadow of her brother and other men at Port-Royal. In doing so, he emphasizes her unique moral philosophy and celebrates her egalitarian model of education that enhanced the authority of women. Jacqueline gives nuns the roles of interpreting faith and morals in ways that were traditionally reserved for men, establishing them as peers to priests and confessors rather than being submissive bystanders. She also embraces the virtue of courage, traditionally considered a masculine virtue, and encourages other women to do the same.
Next, Gilberte Pascal Périer is painted as a defender of Port-Royal (Chapter 3) and, more importantly, of her family. A gifted archivist and shrewd politician, she used the law and pen to guard her family's theological and intellectual legacies. Central to the account that Conley offers is her clash with Father Beurrier, the parish priest who administered the last rights to a dying Blaise; Beurrier claimed he renounced Jansenism on his deathbed. After years of campaigning and threatening legal action against publishers, Gilberte managed to smother the false narrative: in reality, Blaise's dissatisfaction was limited to Arnauld and Pierre Nicole, and even then only in regard to how the later crisis of the signature was handled.
Gilberte's literary legacy lies in her Life of Monsieur Pascal (1668), her Life of Jacqueline Pascal (c. early 1660s), and as an editor of fragments written by her late brother, which would become -- not without controversy -- the Pensées. Like the previous chapter, Conley's analysis of Gilberte's work is approached thematically: from her writing we see portraits of Blaise and Jacqueline, her defense of her family's orthodoxy in the face of pressure to submit, and her educational philosophy (which is taken from three of her letters). Conley allows Gilberte to speak for herself, offering insight into both the lives of her siblings and her role in preserving their works. She was alone in demanding the Pensées fragments be left in the order closest to the one her brother arranged. Though the opposing Port-Royal editors won, the preserved manuscript that Gilberte preferred has since become the scholarly standard.
The fourth chapter shows Marguerite Périer as a gifted rhetorician and apologist for Jansenism. Her works are often polemics that portray her family members as martyrs guided by divine providence and for whom religious conversion was the focal point of their life narratives. Known for her insightful (and sometimes amusing) family anecdotes, she provides a perspective of Port-Royal's happenings different from those of her mother, aunt, and uncle. For example, she describes the Provincial Letters as a collaborative effort. Conley summarizes her writings, which include Additions to the Necrology of Port Royal (1723), several books memorializing her family and other important Jansenists such as Duc de Roannez, and her Profession of Faith (1732). Like her mother, Gilberte, Marguerite takes liberties when retelling her family's story. Conley admirably notes some places where her descriptions of Jacqueline and Blaise deviate from her mother's (and sometimes even from her own). This is a feature of her work rather than a flaw, as her revisionism comes in the form of skillfully crafted rhetoric. In her Profession of Faith, Marguerite defends the Jansenists and papal fallibility, representing a bolder new generation of Jansenists who, by the time that the 1713 papal bull Unigenitus was declared, had dropped all pretense of adhering to condemnations through sophistry; they explicitly accuse the pope of erroneous judgment. Conley addresses these themes in a section on philosophical creed, as well as sections on Augustinianism and Family Identity and what Conley calls Blaise's philosophical militancy. The chapter ends, not looking at Marguerite's philosophical contributions like the previous two did, but considering Port-Royal itself as a philosophical site.
There are many features to admire about this book it brings welcomed attention to the Port-Royal women's philosophies, and it makes a compelling case for the importance of studying Jacqueline, Gilberte, and Marguerite for their own sake and not just in relation to Blaise. The book helpfully sketches out the Pascal family's engagement with the Port-Royal community, walking through events central to both parties (such as the crisis of the signature and crisis of the dowry) with admirable exactness. The reader will see where the Pascal family fits in the scientific salons that were formative to their literary development, the religious spheres of institutions in which they operated, and seventeenth-century Paris more broadly. For instance, Conley teases out Gilberte's ongoing tension between the ideals of Jansenist purity and the pragmatic concerns of aristocratic material successes and luxuries, which is an important subtext in her writing.
Without negating the book's successes, there are several points of concern and missed opportunities. The first is that Conley's audience is not obvious: at times he painstakingly outlines moments in Jansenist history that are fairly well known by historians of early modern philosophy (such as Arnauld's involvement in the controversy of the signature) while also breezing over less common knowledge, such as the difference between pedagogies practiced at petites écoles and convent schools, which is central to understanding how Jacqueline and Gilberte's educational practices were different from those of their male counterparts. So the historian of philosophy may find the read too simplistic at points, while the reader who is not a historian may sometimes be left confused.
Conley also makes some curious language choices. He has a tendency to use unnecessary adjectives that distract from his point, and seem to paint a bias unusual for the history of philosophy. Pascal's philosophy is called "militant" and their Augustinianism "radical." This risks dismissing the variations and complexity of views coming from Port-Royal. It also risks undermining aims of his book: for Jacqueline to demand her legally entitled share of the dowry is anything but extremist, for instance, and his language choices risk coloring the convent, and thus the nuns within it, as somehow militant. There is no doubt that Jacqueline's educational model is severe (even for other Jansenists), but it is too simplistic to label the siblings as militants adhering to radical doctrine.
A deeper concern is that Conley provides an excellent historical account, but often fails to provide analysis. This is especially the case when discussing the women's written works, which read more as a literature review than a historical or philosophical exploration. For instance, Conley acknowledges the differences between Gilbérte and Marguerite's narratives of Blaise, but a great deal of the ink spent on these texts simply summarizes them. It would be helpful in this case to outline explicitly the deviations these accounts have from one another and from historical fact. Analyzing the texts in this light exposes their astute rhetorical skill.
When Conley makes the move toward analysis it comes off as dated, especially in his treatment of Blaise and its ramifications upon his sisters. This is particularly regrettable because the historical research in this book is otherwise unprecedented. The book frames Blaise and Port-Royalists as anti-intellectuals and fideists, but, as recent literature outlines, Blaise's criticisms of reason lay not with its soundness, but its ability to generate the level of commitment necessary for faith -- this is why Port-Royal philosophers, including Blaise, were so ready to write Cartesian textbooks while also criticizing Cartesianism as useless (see Pensées fragment S118/L84). Thus while we can have scientific knowledge, assenting to a religious proposition's truth does not generate the type of belief that brings about conversion. Blaise is also painted as an anti-philosopher, which is strange considering that he has a robust metaphysics. Informed by Saint-Cyran, Blaise's ontology is different from Cartesian metaphysics, but deeply philosophical and speculative nonetheless. More attentiveness to the nuances of Port-Royal philosophes additionally reveals the rhetorical genius of Gilberte and Marguerite. Often their descriptions of Blaise and Jacqueline are deeply flawed historically because their purpose is not historical. These texts are designed to defend Jansenism and to control their family's narrative as orthodox.
Conley's Conclusion makes a compelling case that historically women have been excluded from philosophical discourse in part due to narrow definitions of which literary styles are philosophical. Philosophy, however, is expressed through many genres including poetry and pedagogical manuals. Conley shows, for instance, how Jacqueline's moral philosophy is largely told through A Rule for Children, an educational manual, not a treatise. A disconcerting result of the above criticisms, however, is that the reader remains unconvinced that Gilberte and Marguerite are in fact philosophers. Conley is right that philosophy is told through a variety of genres: we see, for example, Sor Juana Inés de la Cruz expressing her Neoplatonism (Primero sueño) and feminist philosophy (Hombres necios) through poetry. But in this book Gilberte is portrayed as a gifted politician and archivist, someone who leverages her knowledge of law and rhetoric to defend her family. Marguerite likewise is described as a master polemicist who defends Jansenism with her quill. But even contextual historians of philosophy who appreciate a multiplicity of philosophical expressions may find the case for Gilberte and Marguerite qua philosophers lackluster. Conley had at least two solutions. One was to celebrate Gilberte and Marguerite for the gifted politicians, archivists, and rhetoricians that they were; the other was to convince the reader that what they are doing is indeed philosophy and not something else. In the case of Gilberte, there is no real comparison in her writing to A Rule for Children, and her three letters on education are personal with questionable amounts of philosophy in them. If 'philosopher' does not fit, forcing her into that mold does a disservice to her political acumen and laudatory rejection of authorities in the face of principle, not to mention our indebtedness to her as an archivist. Those alone foster admiration and warrant further study. As much as I want to believe that Gilberte and Marguerite have philosophy among their successes, be cautioned that the book's reader may remain unconvinced.
In spite of my more critical remarks, Conley should be celebrated for bringing attention to these women as intellectuals in their own right.His book's biographical and contextual information along with its Appendix makes it a helpful resource. Those interested in studying the Pascal/Périer women will find the book a useful starting point -- which is a valuable contribution in itself.