The Oxford Handbook of Business Ethics

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George G. Brenkert and Tom L. Beauchamp (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Business Ethics, Oxford UP, 2009, 733pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195307955.

Reviewed by Matt Zwolinski, University of San Diego



Business ethics as an academic field is the child of two parents, neither of whom is completely comfortable with the offspring it has produced. One is philosophy, many practitioners of which regard all species of practical ethics with some suspicion as lacking in rigor and philosophical originality. And business ethics seems especially suspect — philosophers are not immune to making the tired joke that business ethics is an oxymoron. The field’s other parent — management studies — is equally ill at ease with its child, but for opposite reasons. For those whose academic home is the business school, business ethics can often be too abstract, too disconnected from empirical reality, to be of much use in providing a practical guide for managers seeking to confront real-world ethical problems. The field of business ethics, then, has emerged as really two more or less distinct but connected fields, each of which adopts the aims and methodological approaches of one of its two parent fields.

This book is intended to provide an overview of the state of the field of philosophical business ethics. And Brenkert and Beauchamp are to be commended for having put together a collection of contributors and topics that is well-suited for this goal. The contributors are all first-rate scholars who have made important contributions to business ethics or cognate fields. They are also admirably diverse in age, ideology, and methodological approach, thus providing readers with a good glimpse into the wide range of scholarship that characterizes the field. The book will obviously be of interest to those for whom philosophical business ethics is a main area of interest. But the entries are clear and accessible enough to make the book of special value to at least two other groups: those whose approach to business ethics is not primarily philosophical will find here a useful ‘crash course’ in an alternative methodological approach to their own subject, and those philosophers who are not primarily interested in business ethics will be treated to a volume that makes clear the connection between business ethics and more standard philosophical subjects, and that will almost certainly provide them with new ways of thinking about both business ethics and other topics in value theory and political philosophy that are connected with business ethics in ways they might not have previously recognized.

The selection of topics is also admirably comprehensive. The book is divided into nine parts, with a total of 24 articles. The nine parts are: “Basic Philosophical Issues,” “Competitive Markets and Corporate Responsibility,” “Economic Justice and Consumer Rights,” “Universal Norms and the Relativity of Moral Judgments,” “The Use and Protection of Information,” “Incentives and Information,” “Employee Rights and Corporate Responsibilities,” “Safety, Risk, and Harm,” and “Creating Moral Organizations.” In what follows, I will try to provide at least a brief overview of each of these sections. I will have more detailed comments to make on some of the entries, although considerations of space (this book is over seven-hundred pages) require me to be highly selective in this respect.

Part I, “Basic Philosophical Issues,” should be required reading for those approaching philosophical business ethics for the first time. Robert Audi’s “The Place of Ethical Theory in Business Ethics,” is a useful overview of the content of the major ethical theories — including his own preferred intuitionist account — and their relationship to the field of business ethics. Ronald Green and Aine Donovan’s article, “The Methods of Business Ethics,” provides a helpful history of business ethics as an academic field and of the ways in which the tensions between philosophical and empirical approaches to the subject have manifested themselves in both research and teaching. One such manifestation involves the focus on individual managerial decision-making that has tended to dominate the business schools’ approach to business ethics. Questions about how managers should balance competing values, how they should respond to whistle-blowing, and so on, all arise naturally when business ethics courses are taught to students who are preparing for careers as managers. But this focus also tends to move questions about larger structural issues — such as the moral status of capitalism, or the role of business within a just society — to the periphery. In my experience, though, business ethics courses in philosophy departments have too often taken precisely the opposite approach. Since philosophers tend not to have a robust background of experience in the world of business from which to draw, the emphasis on managerial decision making is often downplayed to the point where business ethics is taught as a kind of applied political philosophy. Doing justice to both of these important aspects of business ethics is an ongoing scholarly and pedagogical challenge for the field.

Part II, “Competitive Markets and Corporate Responsibility,” contains several extremely interesting pieces on precisely the broader structural issues that set the context for managerial decision making. Gerald Gaus’ “The Idea and Ideal of Capitalism” notes that business takes place in the context of a generally capitalist market economy, and explores what a pure form of capitalism would look like and what could be said in its defense. He goes on to provide one of the best, most succinct summaries that I have ever read of the various arguments that have been put forward in defense of such a system. Gaus (mercifully) goes beyond the standard Lockean/Nozickian version of libertarianism to consider agency-based defenses of property rights, F.A. Hayek’s arguments regarding the information-conveying capacity of the price system, Ronald Coase’s theories of social cost and of the firm, and more. Meanwhile, Christopher McMahon, in “The Public Authority of Managers of Private Organizations,” sets forward an extremely provocative argument that managers of private corporations wield the same kind of authority that agents of governments do, that a simple consent-based theory will not suffice to justify such authority, and that business ethicists and political philosophers must therefore develop a “political theory of the corporation” (p. 101). Finally, Kenneth Goodpaster’s “Corporate Responsibility and its Constituents” discusses the ongoing debate over corporate social responsibility and argues that both traditional stakeholder and stockholder views could be improved by the development of a kind of “comprehensive moral thinking” (pp. 143-150).

Part III covers issues relating to “Economic Justice and Consumer Rights.” Paul Menzel’s “Just Access to Health Care and Pharmaceuticals” covers debates about employee access to health insurance and related matters, and argues that there may be common moral ground for resolving certain debates about access. The other article in this section, John Boatright’s “Executive Compensation: Unjust or Just Right,” analyzes the morality of CEO pay and argues that, so long as it is not the result of fraud or breach of fiduciary duty, high pay is not a matter of injustice, though it may be socially undesirable if it stems from some form of market failure. Boatright’s article is outstanding for its careful attention to empirics. Its summary of the process used in setting CEO pay, the way CEO pay has evolved in recent decades in response to market and legal changes, and the way that CEO pay fits into the larger economic context will be extremely useful to philosophers who want to explore this topic in their research or classroom. On the other hand, the entry’s treatment of the moral theoretical aspects of the debate is somewhat less satisfying. One wishes that somewhat more engagement had been made with serious philosophical critiques of the justice of executive compensation, for example that found in some of the recent work of Jeffrey Moriarty.1

Part IV addresses “Universal Norms and the Relativity of Moral Judgments.” Tom Beauchamp’s “Relativism, Multiculturalism, and Universal Norms” and Wesley Cragg’s “Business and Human Rights: A Principle and Value-Based Analysis,” cover similar ground. Beachamp’s article makes the case for universal moral norms against moral relativism, and illustrates its importance for business ethics in an era of globalization. Cragg, in turn, asks just what it means to say that business organizations have obligations to respect human rights, considering and rejecting three popular models and setting out his own hybrid model that claims that corporations have “direct, morally grounded human rights obligations” that are a function of the context in which the corporation is active and the likely human rights impact of its activities (p. 269).

The third article, Carol Gould’s “Moral Issues in Globalization,” shows how processes of globalization have raised moral issues for businesses concerning the proper response to poverty and inequality, democratic accountability, labor standards, and environmental justice and sustainability. Gould’s article, like others in the volume, is more of an argumentative piece than a survey of existing literature, and her argument is generally critical of globalization. This, in itself, is not problematic. Her argument, however, would have been much strengthened by a more careful attention to the arguments of globalization’s supporters. As it stands, the moral arguments in favor of globalization are moved over fairly quickly in a few paragraphs lacking citations to any serious scholarship (pp. 307-308), while the remainder of the article provides a lengthy and thorough summary of various criticisms of globalization.

This rather one-sided, dichotomous approach unfortunately leads Gould to miss out on several ways in which debates over globalization often cross traditional ideological lines. For instance, while Gould notes that many of the problems of globalization stem from the “close interconnections between the interests of the state and those of corporations” (p. 311), elsewhere she approvingly cites Herman Daly as characterizing the “race to the bottom” as a product of “free market conditions” (p. 309). Here, Gould misses the opportunity to forge common ground with libertarians in a criticism of the often corporatist form that globalization has taken. There is a difference between defending free markets and defending the interests of corporations, and globalization has all too often taken the latter route.

Similarly, Gould’s discussion of global labor standards and the need to protect workers from exploitation is both too quick and too simple. She cites with approval the International Covenant on Economic, Social and Cultural Rights as specifying that children should be protected from economic and social exploitation. But she neglects to ask (or to address the relevant literature exploring)2 what happens when the exploitation of child labor is legally prohibited, but the neglect of children living in poverty is not. Serious scholars who have explored the issue — even those who are often highly critical of free markets — have argued that caution must be taken in prohibiting child labor lest vulnerable children be deprived of what may very well be a valuable and culturally accepted means of improving their lot and that of their family.3

Part V contains four essays on “The Use and Protection of Information.” Thomas Carson, in “Deception and Information Disclosure in Business and Professional Ethics,” demonstrates just how difficult the issue of truth-telling in business ethics is, discussing when obligations to disclose information exist and what standards should apply to negotiations and advertising, where truth-telling may be extremely disadvantageous and not necessarily expected by the recipient of the information. Richard Spinello’s essay on “Informational Privacy” discusses the concept of privacy, the value of privacy, and what might ground the claim of a right to privacy in the context of a world where cybertechnology makes possible the rapid sharing of large amounts of private information. Richard De George’s entry on “Intellectual Property Rights” provides a useful survey of the historical and legal context of intellectual property and an analysis of the moral arguments that ultimately concludes that they underdetermine the nature and extent of such rights.

Finally, Alan Strudler’s essay on “The Moral Problem of Insider Trading” provides an admirable review of the existing business ethics literature on a puzzling topic — one where there is a great deal of (though not unanimous) agreement about the wrongness of the activity, but hardly any consensus at all regarding the explanation of that wrongness. Strudler, after laying out and criticizing several existing analyses, proposes a novel solution to the problem — explaining the wrongness of insider trading in terms of the notion of unconscionability. Strudler’s argument is that much actual insider trading is wrong because it is a kind of theft — employees are using for their own personal advantage information that rightfully belongs to their employer. This analysis of the wrongness of insider trading, however, leaves open the possibility that insider trading might be justified if employers and employees could legitimately make contracts by which a property right in the relevant information was transferred to the employee. Strudler’s novel move is to suggest that any such contract would be “unconscionable and hence both legally and morally wrong” (p. 398). It would be unconscionable because it would create a gross disparity of benefits between the contracting parties — the employees would benefit by their newfound ability to use corporate information for public gain, while the owners of the corporation, the shareholders, would be placed in a position where they would be vulnerable to various forms of wrongdoing by the employees, such as spreading false rumors or mismanaging company resources in order to manipulate stock prices. Thus, because any contracts permitting insider trading would be wrong, and because insider trading is wrong in the absence of such a contract, insider trading is immoral.

Strudler’s argument here is innovative, but I am not convinced that it is successful. It would be surprising, after all, if we could succeed in explaining the unclear wrongness of insider trading by appealing to a concept that is, if anything, even more notoriously unclear — that of unconscionability. Strudler’s appeal to disparity of benefit, for instance, will not do the trick. Not all contracts that yield a gross disparity of benefit are unconscionable, nor do all unconscionable contracts seem to involve a disparity of benefit.4 And often, when there is a disparity of benefit, it runs in the wrong direction to provide the needed explanation. Cases where A performs an easy rescue of B for a large sum of money seem like paradigm examples of unconscionability. But even if B were to pay $1000 to A to be rescued from drowning, it seems pretty clear that it is B, not A, who reaps the greatest benefit from the exchange. Moreover, the kind of disparity of benefit to which Strudler appeals in this case is unusual. What is wrong with contracts legitimating insider trading, he holds, is not that they split some sum of money or utility unevenly between A and B, but that they put B in a position where she will later be vulnerable to A‘s wrongdoing. But then, why isn’t it A‘s later wrongdoing that is the real target of Strudler’s moral objection? Instead of saying that contracts legitimating insider trading are wrong, why not say that they are permissible but that knowingly spreading false rumors or mismanaging company assets are wrong? Surely, not every agreement that makes one party vulnerable to wrongdoing on the part of another is wrong. We might think they are wrong if the party put in the vulnerable position derives no corresponding benefit, but demonstrating that this would be the case with insider trading contracts would require engaging in the kind of empirical weighing of costs and benefits that Strudler seems to want to avoid.

Part VI discusses issues involving “Incentives and Influence.” Wayne Norman and Chris MacDonald open the section with an exemplary entry on “Conflicts of Interest.” In it, they provide an extremely helpful survey of the competing analyses philosophers have provided of the concept of a conflict of interest. But rather than getting bogged down in conceptual analysis, the authors helpfully note that that project has now “reached a point where reasonable people can disagree” and that a “broad consensus” has emerged on certain core features of the concept, thus allowing business ethicists to focus their energies elsewhere (p. 450). Norman and MacDonald then provide a sketch of how future research on conflicts of interest might be usefully conducted, stressing the importance of examining how mid-level and macro-level (e.g., corporate and political) institutions might be designed so as to minimize or mitigate the seriousness of conflicts of interest. Such inquiries, the authors note, will need to be informed by empirical investigations into areas such as cognitive biases. Such investigation often reveals surprising facts, e.g., that the disclosure of a conflict of interest (often prescribed by ethicists as a morally attractive response) can sometimes be ineffective or even counterproductive insofar as it leads to professionals giving even more biased advice than they would without disclosure (p. 458).

The section is rounded out by an entry from Manuel Velasquez on “Corruption and Bribery” that raises doubts about the widely held belief that business bribery is always immoral, and an essay by Andrew Stark on “Business in Politics: Lobbying and Corporate Campaign Contributions.” Stark takes up the extremely interesting and, to my mind, underworked question of when and under what circumstances it is immoral for businesses to lobby or contribute to political campaigns in the hope of receiving some form of political benefit. His analysis is fascinating, but tries too hard, I think, to base conclusions on the logical structure of certain forms of interaction without drawing on empirical evidence regarding the kinds of outcomes the situations and activities he analyzes actually tend to produce. I hope that future research will seek to integrate such data, and also to engage in more macro-level ethical questions about how political institutions might be designed to reduce corporate rent-seeking or its harmful effects.

Part VII is devoted to issues of “Employee Rights and Corporate Responsibilities.” Two of the entries, Bernard Boxill’s “Discrimination, Affirmative Action, and Diversity in Business” and George Brenkert’s “Whistle-Blowing, Moral Integrity, and Organizational Ethics,” cover subjects that have become mainstays of business ethics courses, and provide helpful summaries of the state of current debates in these areas, as well as arguments for the authors’ preferred resolutions to these debates. John McCall and Patricia Werhane provide an essay on “Employment at Will and Employee Rights” that usefully summarizes the differences between United States and Western European approaches to employee rights, and argues that “employees are entitled to employment-related rights that extend beyond those currently recognized in U.S. law” (p. 603), despite the fact that current trends in Europe have been leading in the opposite direction (p. 623).

Finally, Denis Arnold addresses the subject of “Working Conditions: Safety and Sweatshops,” arguing that employers have moral obligations to inform workers of potential hazards and to ensure that minimum health and safety standards are met, at least when the cost of doing so is small. These obligations are especially pressing in the case of multinational corporations that contract with sweatshops in the developing world, where low wages and dangerous working conditions are not uncommon. Arnold claims that the voluntary implementation of these moral obligations will often be insufficient, and that when they are they ought to be enforced by legal “OSHA-type regulations” (p. 632).

But such regulation poses a problem for those who seek to improve the lives of workers in the developing world. If, as Arnold claims, regulation is only needed to mandate those safety standards that do not produce sufficiently offsetting productivity gains (p. 632), then one of the effects of regulation will be to increase the cost of production. Faced with such an increased cost, corporations might choose to move production to a country that has not enacted such regulation or where the productivity of labor is higher. If costs are high enough, they might decide not to outsource internationally at all but instead to employ domestic labor. Doing so would deprive workers in the regulated country of jobs — jobs that may have been unsafe in certain respects, but that the workers themselves clearly viewed as the best option available to them, as evidenced by their willingness to accept the terms of employment. It will thus have the effect of making people who are already vulnerable even worse off.

Note that this argument does not depend on the claim that sweatshop workers are fully morally autonomous agents, freely choosing from among a vast set of options. Nor does it depend on the claim that background social and economic conditions in the developing world are morally acceptable. Even if those background conditions are horribly unjust — even if we grant the claims of those like Thomas Pogge who claim that those in the developing world are victims of ongoing injustice by countries like the United States — it is nevertheless true that we do no favors to victims of that ongoing injustice by promoting regulation that has the effect of depriving them of the best option they have remaining of improving their lives and those of their families.In a world where compliance with the demands of justice is grossly imperfect, the legal implementation of a right to be free from exploitation can be horribly counterproductive. This, at least, is true when the exploitation concerned consists of interactions that are mutually beneficial relative to the status quo ex ante, and when the alternative to exploitation is not interaction on fairer terms, but no interaction at all.

Arnold does, however, raise one intriguing point that has received less attention than it should in the debate over the morality of sweatshops. He claims that business owners have “an obligation to adhere to local labor laws” (p. 639), but notes that defenders of sweatshops must either “deny or tacitly approve the widespread violation” of such laws (p. 638). This point cannot be adequately addressed within the constraints of a review such as this. But Arnold is right, I think, to suggest that the logic of the argument in defense of the moral permissibility of sweatshop labor holds regardless of whether the sweatshop in question is in violation of local labor laws. Especially where such violations are widely known, it is possible that workers might freely choose (within their severely constrained set of options) to accept employment in spite of these violations, and it is possible that such employment might, again despite the legal violations involved, provide significant net benefits to workers. Indeed, in some cases it might be the case that the employment provides significant benefit to workers precisely because of the violation of labor laws — especially in cases where compliance with the law would increase costs to employers and lead them to reduce wages or employment levels as a result. That such violations might be morally defensible, at least in some cases, seems to me entirely possible.

Part VIII presents two essays on the topic of “Safety, Risk, and Harm.” Lisa Newton’s entry, “Environmental Ethics and Business,” presents a helpful history of environmental concerns and their expression in legal regulation and the theory of business ethics. A case for environmental protection can be made, she argues, even under “standard business assumptions” (p. 665). But coping with the environmental problems of our current world will require moving beyond this to embracing new moral duties and ethical frameworks.

While Newton seeks to expand the moral obligations of businesses, John Hasnas seeks to deflate them. In his essay, “The Mirage of Product Safety,” Hasnas argues that businesses do not, in fact, have a moral obligation to produce safe products. Indeed, it is far from clear, he argues, that the claim that they do is even meaningful. This is because ‘safety’ is an inherently relational concept. What it means for something to be ‘safe’ is a product of complex relationships between “risks, harms, costs, benefits, and persons” (p. 679). We consider the automobiles of today ‘safe’ not because they pose no risk of harm, nor because it would be technologically impossible to reduce that risk. We could, after all, build cars like tanks, and doing so would reduce the risks (at least those to the driver) dramatically. But it would also lead to a staggering increase in the cost of automobiles, and also a dramatic decline in the benefit we derive from them. So in calling automobiles ‘safe,’ we really mean that they are “safe enough, given the benefits we derive, the costs involved in making it safer, the magnitude of the likely harms and their probabilities, and the particular attributes of the person bearing the risk.”

But several of these factors — “benefit, cost, and person” - are inherently subjective (p. 685). What constitutes a benefit, for instance, and what degree of benefit it constitutes, varies from person to person. And this makes the creation of an objective standard of product safety impossible. Thankfully however, Hasnas argues, we do not need to devise an objective standard of product safety. The only obligation that we need to impose upon manufacturers is a duty to disclose non-obvious risks. So long as we do this, individuals will be able to express their own risk-averse or risk-courting preferences on the market. Indeed, so long as we respect freedom of contract, a social standard of safety would be largely irrelevant insofar as it would merely provide a baseline around which parties could negotiate for a package that best suits their individual desires.

Part IX consists of just one essay, Norman Bowie’s “Organizational Integrity and Moral Climates.” The previous eight sections have addressed questions of what moral obligations businesses or their agents have. Bowie’s essay addresses the question of how organizations can foster climates in which these obligations are taken seriously and complied with. In so doing he reflects on a number of themes that arose in earlier essays, including the significance of conflicts of interest, the relationship between ideal and nonideal theory, and the relationship between micro, mid-, and macro-level ethical theory. It is a fitting conclusion to the book, both insofar as it suggests ways in which the abstract philosophical theorizing of the preceding chapters might be implemented at a practical level, and because it presents the reader with some wide-ranging reflections from one of the most significant and experienced voices in the field of philosophical business ethics.

The Oxford Handbook of Business Ethics is an extremely useful reference for both the experienced business ethicist and those who seek to understand the field from the outside. There are, of course, certain ways in which it might have been improved. As is often the case when reading a collection, one wishes that there had been some level of interaction between the various entries, many of which address very closely connected ideas. Hasnas, Arnold, and Carson, for instance, all devote significant attention to businesses’ duty to disclose certain sorts of information. Menzel’s essay on access to pharmaceuticals would have benefitted greatly from addressing some of the issues of intellectual property considered in De George’s essay (and vice versa). Stark’s essay on business lobbying could have benefitted from closer interaction with Norman and MacDonald’s entry on conflicts of interest. And so on. Such interaction would no doubt require a longer time-frame for publication, in order to provide each author time to incorporate reference to the other entries, at least in their references. But I do not doubt that the delay involved would be worthwhile. Another relatively low-cost way of adding value would be to replace the “Suggested Reading” list at the end of each chapter with an annotated bibliography. But these are minor quibbles. No doubt readers of this collection will, as I have here, find much to argue with in certain of the entries. But if the editors’ goal was to provide a comprehensive overview of the current state of business ethics, with all the diversity and disagreement that exists in that field, there is no doubt that they have succeed admirably.

1 See Jeffrey Moriarty, “How Much Compensation Can CEOs Permissibly Accept?,” Business Ethics Quarterly 19.2 (2009), and Jeffrey Moriarty, “Do CEOs Get Paid Too Much?,” Business Ethics Quarterly 15 (2005).

2 See, for instance, my own Matt Zwolinski, “Sweatshops, Choice, and Exploitation,” Business Ethics Quarterly 17.4 (2007). Other essays in the discussion include Benjamin Powell, “In Reply to Sweatshop Sophistries,” Human Rights Quarterly 28.4 (2006), Denis G. Arnold and Norman E. Bowie, “Respect for Workers in Global Supply Chains: Advancing the Debate over Sweatshops,” Business Ethics Quarterly 17.1 (2007), Denis G. Arnold, “Exploitation and the Sweatshop Quandry,” Business Ethics Quarterly 13.2 (2003), and Gordon G. Sollars and Fred Englander, “Sweatshops: Kant and Consequences,” Business Ethics Quarterly 17.1 (2007).

3 See Debra Satz, “Child Labor: A Normative Perspective,” The World Bank Economic Review 17.2 (2003).

4 See, for a classic discussion, Alan Wertheimer, Exploitation (Princeton: Princeton UP, 1996), chapter 2.