The Oxford Handbook of Philosophical Theology

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Thomas P. Flint and Michael C. Rea (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Philosophical Theology, Oxford UP, 2009, 609pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199289202.

Reviewed by Harry J. Gensler, John Carroll University



This book has 26 essays by different authors, mostly from the standpoint of orthodox Christian faith but using tools from analytic philosophy, on topics like revelation, God’s omnipotence, providence, the trinity, and Islamic philosophical theology.

When I read the title, I did not know what to expect. First, is it really a “handbook”? I thought of handbooks on photography and gardening, where you have chapters on different areas neatly divided into topics for easy reference; the writing is brief and to the point — and you can read whole areas or look up specific topics. This book is not like that. The articles read more like journal articles; they are written from distinct perspectives and are often tediously complex. In my opinion, something closer to a genuine handbook (or at least with briefer and simpler articles) would have been more useful, especially in connecting these important but somewhat in-group discussions to a wider group of philosophers and theologians.

Second, what is meant by “philosophical theology” in the title? The term made me think of the 1955 MacIntyre-Flew classic, New Essays on Philosophical Theology, which had essays defending or attacking belief in God. Then I learned that there was also an Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Religion, on a somewhat different area. So how does this present volume differ from that one? Maybe I am slow, but I figured this out only after reading much of the book. I concluded that “philosophical theology” here tends to be theology (in that its premises presume a faith stance, usually a Christian one that appeals to the Bible and Christian tradition) but of a philosophical slant (so it uses philosophical tools and is concerned with foundational questions like "In what sense is the Bible inspired?" instead of theological details like “Was Matthew’s gospel originally written in Greek?”). I wished that the introduction had been clearer on this.

Apart from these two reservations, I think that the book is well done, has top-notch articles from important people in the field, and makes a valuable contribution. It also shows how far we have come in analytic philosophy on discussions of religion. Fifty years ago, in the days of logical positivism, belief in God was generally scorned and ignored in analytic circles; belief was seen as irrational, superstitious, and a relic of the past. Partly because of Alvin Plantinga and others that he inspired, this has changed; theism is now generally regarded as more respectable (even among non-believing philosophers). Among other things, this volume celebrates that change.

The book has five parts. I will give a brief sketch (sometimes simplifying a bit) of the articles in each.

Part 1, which has four essays, treats theological preliminaries and emphasizes the sources of Christian theology. In the first essay, Richard Swinburne discusses revelation. While Christians generally regard the Bible as God’s word, there are problems in taking all of it literally. For example, one part of the Bible urges the extermination of the Canaanite people, while another part advocates non-violence, and Genesis, if taken literally, clashes with modern science. Early Christian thinkers like Origen and Augustine were aware of the apparent contradictions and cautioned against an exclusively literal reading; Augustine suggested that we not take a passage literally if it clashes with purity of life or soundness of doctrine. But why take the Bible as God’s word at all? Swinburne argues that we can know God’s existence from nature and that the Bible fits exceptionally well with how God could be expected to act. He contrasts this view with that of Plantinga, who argues that Christian beliefs are warranted if they are produced by a process put into us by God in order to lead us to the truth.

Stephen Davis discusses revelation and inspiration. God reveals himself so that humans may develop a personal and loving relationship with him. While God reveals himself in both actions and words, the words are important to clarify the actions. The Bible is a record and interpretation of God’s revelation. There are various views about how inspiration works, going from a dictation account (God dictates the biblical words to humans) to a purely secular account (the Bible is a purely human book, like other books, and can give us “inspirational” thoughts). Davis struggles to develop a more balanced account that recognizes the influence of the Holy Spirit to insure somehow that the words of the inspired writers are appropriate.

Del Ratzsch discusses science and religion. We can see the two as entirely unrelated, as in conflict (so we must choose between them), or as in dialogue (so that they can mutually enlighten each other); he argues for a version of the last approach. When reading this, I was at first unclear how it fit into “theological preliminaries”. Then I realized that how we interpret the Bible depends in part on what we do when it seems to clash with science (or with other secular subjects, like history).

William Wainwright urges the importance of mystery in our halting understanding of God and he discusses forms that mystery can take. This essay would perhaps fit better in the next section, especially since Christian thinkers almost uniformly believe that God to a great degree is beyond our understanding.

Part 2, containing six essays, is about divine attributes. First, Jeffrey Brower heroically defends the doctrine of God’s simplicity. This doctrine claims that there is no metaphysical composition in God, so God = God’s existence = God’s essence = God’s goodness = God’s power. Many Christian thinkers today ignore this as verbal nonsense, as a category error, or as wrongly identifying God (a person) with properties (like goodness). Brower argues for an interpretation of the doctrine in terms of “truthmakers”.

Edward Wierenga analyses and defends God’s omniscience. The chief problem here is how God can know perspectival truths (like “I am feeling chilly now” as said by a specific person at a specific time) and future free actions (like “I will run later today”).

William Craig argues that we should not regard God as existing timelessly. This essay was a model of clarity and logical rigor — and was my favorite essay of the book.

Brian Leftow analyses and defends God’s omnipotence. The chief problem he considers that there seem to be things that God cannot do but that we can do — like hate, or fail at a task, or take a walk.

Hud Hudson discusses God’s omnipresence, focusing on what it means to say that God is everywhere. Does it imply that God is a spatial, hence material, being? Or is the universe God’s body? Or maybe God should be seen as a non-spatial being, like a number? Or maybe saying that God is everywhere simply means that he influences every point of space, sustaining it in existence?

Laura Garcia explores God’s moral perfection, his goodness. Does this attribute mean that God created the best of all possible worlds, and is there any such thing? Or does it mean that he maximizes good consequences, or fulfills all of his duties, or acts from virtuous intentions? If we take “good” to mean “what follows God’s will” (which perhaps we should not do), then is it not vacuous to say that God is “good” (since then it only means that he follows his own will)?

Part 3, made up of seven essays, is about God and creation. First, Robin Collins asks why God would have created us by an indirect evolutionary process that took 14 billion years, depended on random factors, and caused much cruelty to animals. He argues that this approach best realized different kinds of human connectiveness.

Thomas Flint discusses divine providence. The chief problem is free will: how can God be assured to bring his plans to fulfillment when free beings have the ability to mess things up? After finding fault with the “Thomist” and “open theism” answers (which he sees as watering down respectively free will and God’s providence), he endorses a solution that follows the sixteenth-century Jesuit, Luis de Molina. The key here is that God has, besides knowledge of ordinary necessary and contingent truths, a “middle knowledge” of counterfactuals like “If Sarah is in circumstances C and freely chooses what to do, then she will do A” — and that this middle knowledge enables God to arrange things so that his plans will succeed.

Scott Davidson discusses petitionary prayer. He suggests that God has “answered” a particular prayer provided that the prayer is for something good and that God brings the thing about at least in part because of the prayer. He gives reasons for being skeptical that prayers are answered. For example, would not God do the good thing even if we did not pray for it? And how can we know that our prayer made a difference to what God did? He suggests that the point of petitionary prayer may be more to change us than to change God.

Mark Murphy, in a complex but clear essay, argues against the views of Phillip Quinn, Robert Adams, Linda Zagzebski, and some natural law theorists, who contend that God somehow explains morality.

Paul Draper discusses and criticizes deductive and Bayesian-probabilistic arguments against the existence of God based on the existence of evil. Unlike most of the authors, Draper is an agnostic and does not argue from a theistic perspective.

Michael Murray’s discussion of theodicy (about why a perfect God would permit evil) fits fairly well the “handbook” model (where you can look up specific subtopics). Murray explains, fairly simply, what a theodicy is and why many recent thinkers are hesitant to engage in it; they think that we need only a “free-will defense” to rebut the non-believer’s arguments against belief in God and that we do not know enough to construct a theodicy. Murray then discusses critically the explanations of evil as punishment for sin, as the natural consequence of sin, as the misuse of free will, and as needed for “soul-making”. He finally discusses various reasons that have been given for why a perfect God would permit animal suffering.

Michael Bergmann defends a view curiously called “skeptical theism”. Some attack belief in God by first pointing out some horrific evil (perhaps about the suffering of an innocent child or animal) and then pointing out that no one has found a good reason for a perfect God to permit such an evil. They then conclude that a perfect God would have no good reason to permit such an evil. “Skeptical theists” reject this inference. While they believe in God, they are skeptical about our human ability to know why a perfect God permits particular evils.

The six essays in Part 4 are about distinctive Christian beliefs. I was disappointed that the idea of mystery occurred so seldom in this part; after all, God seemingly does not limit his revelation to what fits easily into our little heads.

First, Michael Rea discusses the trinity. The logical problem here is that if the Father, Son, and Spirit are God — and distinct from each other — then it seems that there must be three Gods. (If Fido, Spot, and Fufu are dogs — and distinct from each other — then there must be at least three dogs.) Rea’s solution involves the notion of “relative identity”. If you use a statue for a pillar: the statue and the pillar are the same material object, but they need not be identical in every respect (since erosion could destroy the statue without destroying the pillar). Similarly the Father, Son, and Spirit could be the same God without being identical in every respect.

Oliver Crisp discusses how Christ’s life and death can atone for sins. He argues for a penal-substitution model over views based on ransom, satisfaction, or moral example.

Richard Cross discusses the incarnation: the belief that God became man in Jesus Christ, who has two natures (divine and human). The logical problem here is that Christ would seem to have incompatible properties, e.g., being eternal (as divine) and being born on a specific date (as human). Cross mentions various solutions, including somehow qualifying Christ’s properties — so that he is eternal-as-divine but born-on-a-specific-date-as-human — and seeing Christ as having two intellects, but he admits that philosophical reflection on the incarnation is a work in progress.

Trenton Merrick considers the resurrection of the body at the end of the world. He asks how this will work and why we would want to spend eternity in a body. On the second question, he argues that resurrection of the body is our only shot at immortality, since we are our bodies. Merrick thinks that we do not exist between death and our bodily resurrection.

Jerry Walls discusses heaven and hell, focusing especially on whether eternal torment is compatible with God’s goodness. He suggests that it may be continually possible to turn to God after death, that any who are lost forever would be so because they continually choose after death to reject God. He also considers the idea that eventually all may be saved.

Alexander Pruss discusses the Eucharist. He defends the coherence of the idea that the bread and wine are really (and not just symbolically) transformed into the body and blood of Christ. While reading this very intricate essay, it occurred to me that many medieval scholastic philosophers, if brought into the present age and given a copy of this book, would be overjoyed — while the traditional enemies of scholasticism would see most of this book as logical nitpicking.

Part 5 has three broad, historical essays on philosophical theology in non-Christian traditions. Daniel Frank discusses three Jewish figures: Moses Maimonides, Saadya Gaon, and Moses Mendelssohn. Oliver Leaman considers historical figures and issues in Muslim philosophy. Finally, John Berthrong discusses figures and issues in Confucianism and the ways in which it can be considered a religion. These historical essays clash somewhat with the analytic character of the rest of the book and leave us longing a bit for a similar broad historical sketch of Christian philosophical theology.

I see this book as a worthwhile collection of complex essays. Again, I would have preferred a simpler work of about half the size that would appeal to a wider audience of philosophers and theologians. In any case, the book is a tribute to how far we have come in analytic discussions of religion in the last fifty years; the logical positivists of old must be rolling over in their graves!