The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy in Early Modern Europe

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Desmond M. Clarke and Catherine Wilson (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy in Early Modern Europe, Oxford University Press, 2011, 595 pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199556137.

Reviewed by Karen Detlefsen, University of Pennsylvania


This book is among the latest in the Oxford Handbook of Philosophy Series, and as its title notes, it covers philosophy in Europe in the early modern period. Needless to say, this is a massive undertaking. Editors Desmond Clarke and Catherine Wilson are "aware that there are important philosophical issues in the early modern period that [they] were unable to address adequately or indeed at all" (6-7). Nonetheless, the volume provides admirable coverage of a wide range of topics, with essays often playing nicely off of one another without repetition.

The editors compiled the papers with a couple of goals. As a whole, the volume is meant to "survey a number of the most important developments in the philosophy of the period, as these are expounded in texts that have since become very familiar and in other texts that are undeservedly less well-known" (1). Moreover, the editors want "to make evident the fluid boundaries in the early modern period between deductions from experimental science and philosophical theory, and to consider the impact on philosophy of historical and political events -- explorations, revolutions and reforms, inventions, and discoveries" (1). That is, Clarke and Wilson aimed to assemble a collection of papers that take the now well-known contextualist approach to the history of philosophy. In general, the papers satisfy this broad aim, though a few are more narrowly focused on one or more canonical figures or on internal analysis of the philosophical arguments of an early modern thinker. This is not a criticism. The range of topics, authors and styles is most welcome since it shows the healthy variety of approaches to the history of early modern philosophy taken by present day scholars.

The editors have assembled a diverse group of authors from both sides of the Atlantic and Pacific, from north to south, and even have brought into the fold some thinkers from history and law. The 26 papers cover five main areas: metaphysics and natural philosophy; the mind, the passions, and aesthetics; epistemology, logic, mathematics, and language; ethics and political philosophy; and religion. Over 100 early modern thinkers are discussed, including some rarely treated as philosophers and others who are discussed to provide extra-philosophical context; other thinkers who have dominated scholarship of early modern philosophy appear less frequently than usual (I could find just a single reference to Hume, and then only as a set up to an in-depth treatment of primary and secondary qualities by others).

While the volume does provide a survey of early modern European philosophy, few of the papers are suitable for the philosophical novice, and it will not provide much more than one or two essays of relevance to any one field of focused research. But it is a wonderful guide to the general contours of philosophical thinking in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries, valuable for from advanced undergraduates through seasoned scholars of early modern thought interested either in gaining a renewed appreciation of the philosophical spirit of the time, or in discovering "some new questions to pursue . . . [and] areas that are ripe for further exploration" (2). In this review, I discuss the papers by looking at some themes which reappear across a number of them.

One typical story told about the early modern period is that this period marks a shift away from Aristotelian Scholasticism toward decidedly modern ways of thought. This idea is in the background of a number of different papers, and it is treated explicitly and substantially in a few, some of which show the move away from Aristotelianism in specific areas of thought and others of which challenge this supposed shift. Peter R. Anstey's paper on "Essences and Kinds" is a worthy piece to kick off the volume as well as the section on metaphysics and natural philosophy. Anstey details the shift away from appeals to Aristotelian substantial forms to answer crucial questions pertaining to essences and kinds (13-14). He then provides an account of the early modern period's

most important and influential approach to essences and kinds . . . [that is] the analysis of essence of all material substances solely in terms of corpuscular structure, a structure which, it was claimed, is also the basis for the sorting of token substances into species or kinds (12).

Anstey focuses his discussion on a careful and subtle philosophical analysis of Descartes' (14-18), Boyle's (18-24), and Locke's (24-28) philosophical approaches to essences and species, including philosophical weaknesses of those approaches.

R. W. Serjeanston's paper on "The Soul" (in the second part of the volume which deals with the mind, the passions, and aesthetics) joins Anstey's in explicitly arguing for an early modern turn away from Aristotelianism toward new approaches. By the early eighteenth century, the argument goes, "the soul has been transformed from an object of Aristotelian natural science to become the starting point for the moral and historical 'science of human nature' of the Enlightenment" (137). In making this argument, Serjeanston traces a number of reactions against Aristotelianism, including the Cartesian rejection of the tripartite soul, and thus rejection of the soul's close association with biological life (129), as well as Hobbes's materialist approach which aims to account for "human nature without a soul" (134).

Mary Tiles's "Form, Reason, and Method" (in the third section of the volume on epistemology, logic, mathematics, and language) notes that "Aristotelian logic was demoted and the status and importance of mathematically formulated laws and mathematical methods were enhanced" (295), and that this development both contributed to changes in science and was enabled by rapid mathematical advances which started in the sixteenth century. Tiles provides a number of examples of this development, including an in-depth discussion of Isaac Barrow (308ff) in whose work two "important shifts" away from Aristotelianism are demonstrated: a rejection of the "distinction between pure and applied mathematics" and the belief that "the whole of physics is really applied geometry" (309).

Some papers indicate the endurance of Aristotelian thought or at least the fact that the rejection of Aristotelianism was not always as prevalent as one might think. José R. Maia Neto's paper on "Scepticism" (third section) does treat in some depth the skepticism of Descartes who is surely among those who "used [Pyrrhonian scepticism] for aims alien to scepticism itself, such as combating Aristotelianism" (228). But the paper shows the richness in kinds and uses of skepticism in the Renaissance, in Descartes himself (who has many aims with his skepticism besides the refutation of Aristotelianism), and in the early eighteenth century (227). As just one example, Maia Neto draws a conceptual thread from Montaigne (who employed Pyrrhonianism as "a coherent and personal scepticism" rather than against Aristotelianism; pp. 228), through Charron (in the tradition of Academic skepticism; pp. 228-30) to Descartes, all of whom used skepticism to refute mere probability in theoretical knowledge (234-5).

Similarly, P.J.E. Kail problematizes the anti-Aristotelian story, this time in value theory, in his "Virtue and Vice" (in the fourth part of the volume, on ethics and political philosophy). Kail takes on the "hitherto popular idea" that "Aristotelian-inspired virtue ethics did not . . . flourish in the minds of thinkers" such as Descartes and many other early modern figures (363). While his paper does not focus exclusively on Aristotelian virtue ethics, he does argue for an important role for virtue -- and not just for duty -- in early modern ethics, both on the continent (Descartes' and Spinoza's different appropriations of Stoic virtue as control of the passions; pp. 364-9) and in Britain (for example, the Cambridge Platonists' virtue as harmony of the soul which embodies decidedly Aristotelian strains as well; pp. 369-74).

A second, closely related theme, which plays out in interesting ways throughout the volume is the rapid rise and influence of the mechanical philosophy throughout this period. In a thought-provoking paper on "The Mechanical Philosophy" -- surely among those contributions most likely to spur future research -- Helen Hattab notes the open-endedness of that concept and so proposes we take as our starting point "the mechanical ideal" which gained prominence in the Renaissance. The ideal is captured roughly by attempts to give "geometrical explanations of the working of simple machines" (76), and Hattab believes that "the figures on our list of possible mechanical philosophers . . . minimally share some version of the mechanical ideal . . . [e.g.] the universe/machine analogy" (79). She then examines some of the ways in which some mechanical philosophers developed this ideal, drawing our attention to the often opposing directions these developments took. The rise of this multi-faceted mechanism had far-reaching impact, including, for example, in conceptions of motion.

Emily Grosholz's survey of space and time (chapter 3) in the early modern period is set within a consideration of new ways of conceiving of motion -- and consequently of terrestrial and celestial mechanics -- in the seventeenth century. Grosholz touches on a number of philosophers in her survey, but provides some depth on Galileo, Descartes, More, and Newton before turning to a detailed exposition of themes related to space and time in "the celebrated exchange between Leibniz and Newton, recorded in the Leibniz/Clarke correspondence" (51). Grosholz chooses to organize her essay around this debate in part because it presents the subtleties of a key dispute in the seventeenth century, that between relativists and absolutists with respect to space and time.

Philippe Hamou's "Qualities and Sensory Perception" takes up the issue of secondary qualities, "a distinctively modern doctrine that captures something of the very essence of the new philosophical age" (161). In his philosophically very satisfying contribution, Hamou surveys what is definitive of the primary-secondary quality distinction, the ontology underlying it (grounded in new, mechanistically-inspired conceptions of matter), and the various paths by which early moderns arrived at this distinction.

Gabor Boros's paper on "The Passions" shows how the "mechanical-corpuscular philosophy" led to a new way of treating the passions that was still engaged with moral questions. At the same time, Boros notes "the introduction of new, non-theological values for guiding both the individual and society in the novel social and political conditions of early modernity" (199). He makes his case by looking at Descartes' physiological approach to the passions and Spinoza's geometrical, non-theological approach. Even the resurgence in the last decades of the seventeenth century of theological elements into philosophical thought preserves this newness in ideas about the passions, Boros argues (195-6).

One theme Boros treats at length near the end of his paper -- the passion of love -- is a major idea in Stephen Darwall's excellent piece, "Egoism and Morality." After discussing various forms of egoism and their challenges to morality, Darwall turns to a detailed consideration of forms of egoism in Hobbes and Locke, noting the role played by their philosophies of God and natural law in easing the threat of egoism to morality (391). He then turns to an analysis of the ethics of love as found in Hutcheson (Shaftsbury, Leibniz and Cudworth are also mentioned) as an ethics grounded in the opposite of self-interestedness, that is, other-interestedness, or benevolence.

The fall of Aristotelianism (to the degree that it did fall) and the rise of the mechanical philosophy (in its varied, often opposing forms) had enormous significance for the ontology and epistemology of natural philosophy, themes dealt with by a number of essays in this volume. In one of the volume's historically and philosophically most successful entries, Tad Schmaltz picks up Stillman Drake's idea that throughout the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries motion explained by causes was replaced with motion described as patterns captured by laws (32).[1] But Schmaltz examines this general development in philosophically sophisticated detail from Descartes through Malebranche to Berkeley to show various complexities in this slow evolution in early modern natural philosophy. Descartes, positioning himself against the Scholastics, made "laws central to physics," but he did not thereby contrast laws with causes since bodies, Schmaltz argues, are the causal source of lawful motion. Malebranche "took real causality out of the material world and placed it in God" yet did not fully naturalize laws to take the place of causes since laws were identified with God's efficacious volitions. Only with Berkeley were the two principles -- metaphysics of cause and laws as mathematical principles – disengaged, with the latter now central to physics (46-7). Along the way, Schmaltz weighs in on the vexed topics of Descartes' relation to occasionalism and what Malebranche's occasionalism amounts to.

Justin Smith picks up the mechanistic theme to show how it is applied in the early modern period to the study of living beings ("Machines, Souls, and Vital Principles"). As with Hattab, albeit differing on the details, he notes the expansiveness of the idea of mechanism -- "the category of 'machine' was far more capacious than what is suggested by the well-known figure of the clock with its gear. Machines ran on hydraulic, chemical, and thermal . . . processes" (113) -- an expansiveness on display in various early modern theories about life. Smith deals with an impressive cast of characters to argue for this point as well as for the claim that there was a general trend in thinking about life in these centuries.  This was the move from a pre-Cartesian and Cartesian mechanization of life, through a post-Cartesian trialism (with principles intermediate to rational minds and bodies, such as non-rational souls, being called upon to account for the phenomena of life), back to dualism (e.g., Henry More) where matter itself was seen to have all capacities to explain the behavior of living beings.

Desmond Clarke ("Hypotheses"), Jean-François Gauvin ("Instruments of Knowledge") and Stephen Gaukroger ("Picturability and Mathematical Ideals of Knowledge") all address various aspects of epistemology and methods in natural philosophy. Clarke's wonderful paper shows how the evolving conception of hypotheses led to a gradual change in the idea of what counts as knowledge, which essentially amounted to a rejection of an Aristotelian conception (knowledge is certain) and the emergence of probability in the epistemology of natural philosophy (250; 269-70). Additionally, he examines one early modern view that hypotheses provide causal explanations along with the alternative view that they are mere calculating devices, tying these divergent approaches into the role of theology and faith in early modern natural philosophy.

Gauvin's methodologically broad, and thus refreshing, paper investigates the relation between theory and experiments in natural philosophy with specific focus on the role of instruments in this relation. While more historically oriented, this essay nonetheless delves into the theoretically fascinating questions of what counts as an instrument, what counts as proper training and standard practices in the use of instruments, and how instruments "involved a variety of habitus that constrained the mind and/or body to prescribed practices, from which original knowledge-claims could then be inferred" (333).

Gaukroger's satisfactorily rigorous and subtle essay deals with picturability in (some) mathematical demonstrations in the early modern period and the role of picturability in "cognitive grasp" (339). He expands on this theme through an investigation of Descartes' mathematics, specifically Descartes' belief in the representational superiority of algebra to geometry (339-45) because

algebraic notation records and makes it easy to grasp the chain of deduction involved in finding the solution, thereby making it clear what has to be done to the known and unknown at each stage, whereas the geometrical solution does not reveal how the conclusion is generated (344-5).

Gaukroger also investigates the role of picturability in Leibniz's and Newton's opposing approaches to calculus and the nature of infinitesimals (347ff).

In her superb contribution to the volume, "Realism and Relativism in Ethics," Catherine Wilson makes explicit yet another theme that runs through several papers, the relation between the divine on the one hand and the natural and the human on the other, including a general trend toward naturalism (while also acknowledging an enduring role for God, not least of all in the philosophy of Kant, 420). Noting the emergence of, for example, European global exploration and attendant travel literature, religious strife, and humanistic skepticism (e.g., Montaigne's), Wilson poses a central question of early modern life: "In the vast catalogue of actual and possible human practices and conventions, were there right and wrong ways to structure human relations, and, if so, how could they be determined?" (404) What follows is a survey of various approaches to realism and relativism in ethics from key ancient and medieval philosophers through to some early modern thinkers. Throughout, Wilson makes the cases that there are a myriad of ideas on the source of moral authority and that evil is regarded in different ways, some objective and some subjective. But a clear trend emerges:

Philosophical opinion shifts from the position that moral rules are commands of God . . . to the position that moral rules are formulas for the harmonious social life that we prefer, that are supported by the emotions of sympathy and motivated by a purely human desire for security and the general good (419).

Wilson underscores two crucial features of this trend: that human welfare ought to be secured now through laws and institutions rather than in the afterlife through grace, and that God is no longer necessary for securing such welfare, which may be satisfied by something in the natural and human world.

Eileen O'Neill's characteristically rich, far-reaching and innovative "The Equality of Men and Women" implicitly picks up the idea explicitly stated by Wilson of an emerging naturalism, with naturalism taken as a turn away from Scripture and God and toward the natural and human world. At the same time, O'Neill's piece drives home the understanding, found in Wilson's paper too, that this is merely a general trend, and that there are significant strains of theology in many a thinker. O'Neill's paper takes up "a distinctive genre [which] provided arguments for women's fitness for education, for political authority, and for more active roles in society" (445), looking at this genre -- which came to be captured by the term Querelle des femmes -- first in general and then as it was addressed by four French theorists. She draws our attention to the fact that "in the early modern period, authors increasingly began to theorize equality not in terms of sameness, but with sexual/gender differences in mind", and as her four thinkers (Gournay, Poullain, Suchon and Lambert) show, "metaphysics and epistemic systems as diverse as Pyrrhonian scepticism, Aristotelianism, and Cartesianism were the backdrop to discussions of equality of the sexes" (448). An important idea in all four figures examined by O'Neill is the understanding that women's constrained social and educational opportunities have contributed to their (consequently inessential) inequality, and that whatever significant appeals they may make to God and Scripture, this source of inequality is squarely in the power of humans to correct -- a theme reminiscent of Wilson's broad conclusion that human welfare here and now, and disengaged from God, emerged as important in this era.

Naturalism, in a somewhat different but closely related form, appears also in Paul Russell's paper on "The Free Will Problem", a subtle analysis of "Hobbes's understanding of the role of liberty in the foundations of morals". Specifically, Russell argues that (starting with Bramhall) Hobbes's naturalistic science of morality has been misunderstood and consequently unfairly dismissed as "far too thin and insubstantial a foundation on which to rest the edifice of morality" (425). Russell's paper is a fine example of close, internal (but not thereby historically flat-footed) philosophical analysis through which he offers a convincing case against taking Hobbes as a simple compatibilist (carefully defined by Russell; 433ff). Russell argues in favor of coupling Hobbes's account of liberty with his "account of the origin of (civil) law and sovereign authority in the (free) consent of subjects who are capable of speech and reason" (441) in order to understand the foundations, according to Hobbes, of moral life.

Ian Hunter's "Natural Law as Political Philosophy" looks at natural law in seventeenth-century England and Germany to show its massive influence on the history of political thought (475). Given the various understandings of "law" and "nature", the meaning of "the laws of nature" was "ceaselessly formulated and reformulated" (476). So Hunter's chapter focuses on various formulations of the idea of natural law and on both its natural and divine connotations. Starting with an account of Scholastic natural law (Aquinas, 476-9), he then turns to reactions against Scholasticism, both in England (Grotius, Hobbes, and Locke; 479-86) and Germany. In the last section of his paper (486-96), he examines how Pufendorf uses Hobbesian natural law against Christian natural law theorists while also altering Hobbes's approach to avoid perceived drawbacks of the earlier thinker's materialism.

The relation between the natural and the divine also appears in papers not focusing on value theory. Steven Nadler's "Conceptions of God" (in the final section, on religion) looks at three such conceptions. First (often called the intellectualist conception) is the God who acts "as we act, on the basis of practical reasoning" (525); this is the God of Leibniz and Malebranche. Second (often called the voluntarist conception) is the God whose "will is absolute, unguided, and unmotivated by any independent reasons or considerations of truth, goodness or beauty" (529); this is the God of Descartes and Arnauld. Third is Spinoza's God; "motivated by an extreme anti-anthropomorphism, [this conception] rules out any depiction of God that involves Him considering alternative possibilities, acting for purposes, making choices based on reasons, and assessing outcomes" (538). Nadler considers philosophical and theological motivations for, and criticisms of, each view and argues that a foundational issue at stake is the question of whether or not humans can conceive of God, especially in human terms. The voluntarist denies God's conceivability, while both the intellectualist and Spinoza believe that the human can conceive of God, the former because of God's likeness to us, and the latter because nature (what God is) is knowable by us.

Pauline Phemister ("Ideas") also addresses, among many other topics, early modern attitudes toward God and nature, showing how, in the seventeenth century, there was a shift from considering ideas to be archetypes in God's mind to considering them to be objects or perceptions in human minds (Descartes, Arnauld, and Locke). The shift was not complete, however, for Malebranche resisted it, siding with the traditional interpretation (145). Phemister looks at the subtlety and complexity of these figures' approach to ideas, focusing on whether and why ideas were viewed as objects or as acts of perception (or both), on the representational character of ideas, and on how we might draw a meaningful distinction between rationalists and empiricists by considering their theories of ideas.

The gradual turn away from the divine and toward the natural world surely contributed to the emergence of a new appreciation of the individual and her rights, a theme already approached in a number of papers discussed. It is a theme front and center in papers by Ursuala Goldenbaum ("Sovereignty and Obedience") and Philip Milton ("Religious Toleration"). Goldenbaum focuses on the citizen's relation to her state, building the case that the so-called constitutionalist theories of the early modern period were not the source of modern-day individual human rights. She argues this by surveying various meanings of the claim that "the people" have a right to resist the king, showing that "the people" were rarely individuals but were other entities such as, for example, the Catholic Church (505). Rather, according to Goldenbaum, "the naturalistic and individualistic" (518) political theories of Hobbes and Spinoza, and the later individualistic theories of Pufendorf, Locke and Wolff are the proper source of modern conceptions of human rights.

Milton turns to a consideration of varying views on the individual's religious rights against authoritarian control of those rights. Milton argues that Hobbes, Spinoza, Locke and Bayle are all opposed to the religious clergy wielding coercive power over individuals (588), but they differ in attitudes toward civil authority over individuals. Due to the potential power of religion to disrupt civil society, Hobbes and Spinoza both endorse "civil authorities controlling and managing religion for essentially secular purposes" (588), in their case civic control, while also allowing dissenting religious views where they would not impact civil stability. Locke also advocates the prohibition of religious beliefs that threaten civil society but advocates considerably more religious freedom than do Hobbes and Spinoza, since Locke does not believe religion to have the negative power attributed to it by the former two thinkers. Bayle's approach is more equivocal. Siding with Spinoza and Hobbes in the belief that religious toleration could often lead to loss of civic control, he nonetheless sides with Locke due to his own personal experiences with religious persecution.

Alexander Rueger's "Aesthetics" deals with

the role of imagination, judgement, and taste which involved the art theorists in more general issues concerning the passions and their management. . . . [And] the debates about the marvelous in art as an especially effective means of stimulating the audience's passions, that is, its sense of wonder (202).

He approaches these two topics as they appear in the seventeenth century, and so aims to problematize the idea that "between antiquity and the eighteenth century" there was a "great gap" in aesthetics (203).[2] His paper thus aims to uncover various features of seventeenth-century thought -- e.g., discussions found in the rhetorical tradition of the emotional effects of artwork, the debate on the source of the passion of delight -- which laid the groundwork for the emergence of aesthetics proper in the next century.

Japp Maat ("Language and Semiotics") also shows how the seventeenth century dealt with a topic which seemingly faded in importance during that time: "In their effort to put all learning on a new footing and to scrutinize the foundations of knowledge afresh, the seventeenth-century reformers tended to downgrade the role played by language" (273). Nonetheless, as Maat argues in this exciting article, strides were made in philosophical approaches to language, partly spurred by European global travel and the discovery of new languages, with Chinese script being especially intriguing. Themes Maat deals with include the emergence of attempts to develop a philosophical (or rational) grammar, attempts to develop a universal language, and investigations into the relation between language and thoughts as undertaken by, for example, Bacon, Descartes, Hobbes and Locke.

The importance of studying the philosophy of language in this era comes to the fore in Clarke's second piece for the volume, "The Epistemology of Religious Belief," in which he deals with, among many other rich and thought-provoking topics, the links among language, meaning, and human concepts as they apply to God and God's mysteries and as they are examined in the controversy between Berkeley and William King (564-7).

This volume succeeds admirably. There are many excellent essays that will bear intellectual fruit through multiple readings. There are clear points of dissent between various papers in the volume: the degree to which God and theology maintain a role in philosophy as these two to three centuries progressed is one; the way the term "naturalism" is used is another. Similarly, there are controversial claims and arguments throughout. This is to be welcomed, of course, and it is precisely these points of dissent and controversy that will spur the sort of discussion and future research which the editors hope for. On the whole, there is less in this volume for the philosopher who favors detailed analysis and criticism of philosophical arguments and positions, and more for one who favors broad intellectual trends and the historical context of such trends. But it is still relatively well balanced methodologically, as it is thematically. It would be a valuable resource for any philosopher or historian of the early modern period.

[1] Drake, S. (1981). Cause, Experiment and Science. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, xxv.

[2] Tatarkiewicz, W. (1974). History of Aesthetics, vol. II. The Hague: Mouton.