The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Cognitive Science

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Eric Margolis, Richard Samuels, and Stephen P. Stich (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Cognitive Science, Oxford University Press, 2012, 576pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195309799.

Reviewed by Kenneth Aizawa, Centenary College of Louisiana


This is a collection of twenty-two papers reflecting a "Rutgers" perspective on the field. There are, for example, chapters on computationalism, the modularity of mind, innateness, the language faculty, and representationalism, but no chapters on connectionism, dynamical systems, enactivism, (cognitive) neuroscience, or phenomenology. The selection of topics does not necessarily favor more traditional issues over more recent developments, for there are chapters on up-and-coming topics, such as, perception and multimodality, embodied cognition, and experimental philosophy. Yet, even with twenty-two chapters, there are worthy topics that are likely omitted only for lack of space. These include haptics, imagination, pain, and vision.

The great majority of the papers offer an overview of a topic, but most also advocate for a particular philosophical position among the available alternatives. Thus, to note a few examples, Frances Egan favors a specific account of the role of representation in computational theories of cognition, Gualtiero Piccinini offers an account of how the mathematics of computation should relate to physics, and Jesse J. Prinz champions a "somatic appraisal" theory of the emotions. This gives the papers a value not necessarily shared by the articles in the fantastic Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

"Introduction: Philosophy and Cognitive Science" (Richard Samuels, Eric Margolis, and Stephen P. Stich) constitutes as much an introduction to the nature of philosophical research in this area as it does an introduction to the papers included in the volume. This research is interdisciplinary and scientifically informed. It touches on traditional metaphysical questions such as the nature of mind, the relationship between thought and language, and the nature of specific mental capacities. It speaks to foundational issues regarding the ontology of the mind (computation, representation, consciousness, concepts, attention, language) and meta-theoretic issues, such as the relations among potentially contributing disciplines (such as evolutionary biology).

"Consciousness and Cognition" (Robert van Gulick) provides a brisk survey of the landscape. It begins with brief expositions of five putative types of creature consciousness and five putative types of state of which one might be conscious. Theories of consciousness are then divided into three genera: the philosophical (whose species are representationalism, higher-order theories, multiple drafts, and qualia realist), the cognitive (whose species include global workspace, intermediate level representationalism, and information integration) and the neurobiological (whose species include neural synchrony, global workspace, and local recurrence). The chapter concludes with a brief discussion of first-person "introspective" methods versus third-person "objective" methods, with somewhat more discussion devoted to the latter. Given the vast amount of philosophical and scientific work on consciousness in the last decade, the volume could have easily included two distinct chapters on consciousness.

"Reasoning and Rationality" (Colin Allen, Peter M. Todd, and Jonathan M. Weinberg) is structured around the apparent failures of a "Residual Cartesianism." This Cartesianism maintains that human rationality is to be understood as a set of brain-internal, species-typical, domain-general, universal logico-mathematical processes intimately connected to human linguistic capacities. Opposed to this picture are cases in which humans invoke heuristics that generally work only in specific contexts, hence in which human rationality is not domain-general. Rationality may not be brain-internal insofar as humans sometimes rely upon the structure of their environments to simplify, enable, or make more reliable the behaviors they perform in order to accomplish certain tasks. Universality is challenged by the discovery of cross-cultural differences in patterns of reasoning.

"Massive Modularity" (Richard Samuels) is a modestly skeptical examination of the claim that the perceptual and "higher" cognitive capacities of the mind are largely or entirely constituted by many modules. By a "module", one might expect a Fodorian mechanism (Fodor, 1983) that performs a limited range of functions (i.e., is domain specific) with a limited range of information (i.e., is informationally encapsulated). Contrary to those expectations, the massive modularity (MM) thesis typically uses a less restrictive, less well-defined notion of a module. More than some other chapters, this one outlines some of the principal arguments in the area. These include arguments that MM is more evolutionarily plausible than non-modularity and that MM enables us to perform cognitive tasks that would otherwise be intractable. A problem for MM arises, however, in addressing our representational and behavioral flexibility.

"Perception and Multimodality" (Casey O'Callaghan) introduces a relatively new topic in cognitive science, the study of the interactions among distinct sense modalities. Much of the chapter reviews recent empirical findings, noting how these findings bear on issues such as the unity of consciousness, the nature of perception, the existence of amodal concepts, and the individuation of the senses. Here one might wish for a more detailed exploration of the philosophical ramifications.

"Embodied Cognition" (Lawrence A. Shapiro) provides a measured introduction to the idea that the body plays an important role in cognition. Among the topics are whether the character of one's body has a role in cognition that computational approaches have yet to appreciate and whether successful behavior depends less on the use of mental representations, and more on the physical structures of one's body, than computational approaches to the mind have traditionally supposed.

"Artificial Intelligence" (Diane Proudfoot and B. Jack Copeland) reviews one of the mainstay topics in the philosophy of cognitive science. It argues that Alan Turing did not embrace the "orthodox" interpretation of the Turing test according to which intelligence might be defined as the ability to pass for human in a text messaging conversation. It remains unclear, however, whether cognitive scientists should, or should not, embrace the "orthodox" interpretation. The chapter also claims that the Turing test is the only standard by which to judge whether a machine has genuine intelligence. It argues that there is a fallacy in John Searle's Chinese Room argument that pure symbol manipulation cannot constitute cognition. The fallacy is related to the point that one cannot validly move from the view that Searle, who is in the Chinese Room, does not understand Chinese, to the conclusion that the whole Searle-in-the-Chinese-Room does not understand Chinese. Among the less traditional topics treated are hypercomputers (machines that compute functions not computed by Turing machines) and futuristic predictions about super-human machine intelligence.

"Emotions: How Many are There?" (Jesse J. Prinz) views theories of emotions through the lens of ways in which they postulate more or fewer emotions. Cognitive theories of emotion postulate that emotions are one or another type of cognitive state, such as thoughts, judgments, or appraisals. Yet, the number of cognitive states apparently far outstrips the number of normally recognized emotions. Judging that cigarettes are harmful to one's heath, for example, does not (typically) constitute a fear of cigarettes. Attempts to remedy this problem by invoking a further metaphorically described element of "heat" only make matters worse. The non-cognitive circumplex theory postulates that emotions are two-dimensional entities: they vary in valence and arousal. Such theories, however, are apparently committed to non-denumerably many emotions arranged by different degrees of valence and arousal. A non-cognitive "affect program" theory postulates a small fixed set of basic emotions. A neo-Jamesian "somatic appraisal" theory is urged as one that settles on a plausible scheme for enumerating the diversity of emotions.

"Attention" (Christopher Mole) has an historical organization that begins with the (Broadbent, 1958) idea that attention is related to information processing bottlenecks. On this early model, there is early pre-attentive processing of many physical features of stimuli that pass through an informational bottleneck after which there is attentive processing of semantic features. While there emerged experimental challenges to this picture during the '60's and '70s, there remained variants of it into the '90's. The '90's saw a diminished interest in overarching theories of attention, but over the last decade or so this trend has reversed with a focus on a "biased competition" conception. According to this view, what is attended to is the product of a competition among different coalitions of neurons, each coalition corresponding to some potentially attended item. The bias in the competition may stem from activity in, say, the frontal regions of the brain.

"Computationalism" (Gualtiero Piccinini) has three principal sections. One offers a brief history of "computational" cognitive science. A second provides three accounts of what it takes for a computational formalism to be applicable to a physical system. Simplifying, these accounts maintain that a formalism applies when sequences of states in the formalism are isomorphic to 1) some physical process, or 2) some physical process with appropriate representational elements, or 3) some physical process that has an explanation in terms of the system's parts and the organization of the parts. This discussion reflects a peculiarity of this literature, namely, that the discussion of the relationship between the formal computational and the physical proceeds in isolation from other discussions of the relationship between the mathematical and the physical. Perhaps philosophical work on the relationship between geometry and the structure of spacetime is relevant. A final major section reviews different interpretations of the word "computation" in the thesis that cognition is (a form of) computation, e.g., analog computation, digital computation, or something more "general".

"Representationalism" (Frances Egan) begins with a brief discussion of the thesis that propositional attitudes involve a system of syntactically and semantically combinatorial representations. It next reviews anti-representationalist claims from Gibson (1980), Brooks (1999), and Chomsky (1995) before articulating a "non-standard" version of representationalism for computational theories of cognition. According to this version, computations are characterized mathematically (not semantically). Representations are invoked to explain how using a particular mathematically-specified computation can enable an agent to perform a cognitive task, such as detecting the three-dimensional structure of the environment from a two-dimensional projection.

"Cognition and the Brain" (Rick Grush and Lisa Damm) presents an eclectic set of points in support of the gloomy overarching view that attempts to understand cognition and the brain are messy. If cognition is understood as reasoning, then there are questions to be answered regarding how behavioral and neuroscientific evidence might be brought to bear. The somatic marker hypothesis (Damasio, 1994) complicates the orthodox view of emotion and cognition as separate psychological components. Then there is the radical view that cognition is sensorimotor control, or perhaps, sensorimotor behavior. While this view should probably rejected, we seem to be forced to examine less radical ideas, such as that many behaviors may involve less cognitive processing than cognitive scientists might have formerly expected. Regarding the brain, there is room for doubt whether the firing of action potentials is the only cognitively relevant feature of neurons. And, does the brain realize a Classical, connectionist, dynamical system, or a modern control theoretic architecture?

"The Scope of the Conceptual" (Stephen Laurence and Eric Margolis) nicely organizes five arguments regarding what states involve concepts and five arguments regarding who (adults? pre-linguistic infants? animals?) has concepts. This is a highly informative chapter that vividly conveys the vigorous debate in this area.

"Innateness" (Steven Gross and Georges Rey), while succinctly written, covers a lot of ground and is one of the longest chapters in the book. It begins with a brief historical review of issues separating Rationalists and Empiricists before turning to a few of the many accounts of what innateness might be (section 2) and a discussion of concept nativism (section 3). Among the accounts of innateness discussed are two that are derived from nativism in biology. These approaches focus, in one way or another, on the stability of a trait in the face of environmental diversity. One psychological account of nativism holds that what is innate is what is not learned. The discussion of conceptual nativism focuses on arguments for and against the notorious contention from Fodor (1975) that most concepts expressed by monomorphemic words are innate. What makes for the notoriety is the sense that there are too many monomorphemic words (250,000?), that are quite specific, e.g., "gun," and which would presumably have been of little survival value prior to the development of guns. This issue then gives way to theories of the nature of concepts and a discussion of Fodor's later views (Fodor, 1998, 2008).

"The Language Faculty" (Paul Pietroski and Stephen Crain) makes an extended case for the existence of a language faculty with several core principles that are "logically contingent, specific to human language, and innately determined" (p. 361). While a relatively short and valuable chapter, many readers who are not familiar with the kind of argumentation found in generative linguistics may find it dense and abstract. So, for example, one of the first arguments is that we should not understand the human capacity for language as a set of ordered pairs of signals and interpretations. Why? There are "non-signals" (e. g., ungrammatical strings of words) that can be interpreted. For example,

(1) *The child seems sleeping

is ungrammatical. By contrast, (2) and (3) are grammatical.

(2) The child seems to be sleeping

(3) The child seems sleepy

Native English speakers interpret the ungrammatical (1) as having the same interpretation as (2), but not as (3).

"Language in Cognition" (Peter Carruthers) provides inroads into the cognitive scientific literature regarding ways in which thought is dependent on language. Section 2 reviews the history of the weak Whorfian hypothesis (Whorf and Carroll, 1964) that how humans think is reorganized by their natural languages. Section 3 discusses Lev Vygotsky's (1986) hypothesis that natural language "scaffolds" human development in ways that enable thinking not otherwise possible. Section 4 describes points where it has been proposed that natural language acquisition determines concept acquisition. Section 5 reviews some of the literature suggesting that languages shape how concepts are combined. Section 6 relates language to the System 1 (fast, frugal, parallel, heuristic processing)/System 2 (slow, serial, conscious processing) distinction.

"Theory of Mind" (Alvin I. Goldman), among other things, reviews the principal theories of the capacity to attribute mental states to self and others (a capacity for "mentalizing"), along with the general drift of experimental results that bear on them. "Theory-theory" maintains that mentalizing is the application of naïve psychological theories consisting of principles such as "Persons in pain tend to want to relieve that pain." Children are supposed to acquire these principles by applying domain-neutral discovery procedures to experience in much the way that scientists develop theories through experimentation. "Modularity-nativist" theories maintain that maturation of innate, domain-specific "core" knowledge accounts for the development of children's mentalizing capacities. This putative module is not entirely like the modules from Fodor (1983). According to "Rationality-teleology" theory (Dennett, 1987) mentalizing is the projection of a conception of a rational system onto beings; it is the product of an intentional stance. "Simulation Theory" (Gordon, 2007) takes mentalizing to be a matter of interpreting others in terms of what one would do oneself.

"Broad-Minded: Sociality and the Cognitive Science of Morality" (John M. Doris and Shaun Nichols) advocates collaborativism, the view that optimal human reasoning is substantially social. After reviewing the work of worthy historical figures (Nietzsche, Kant, Mill, et al.) and recent work in cognitive science that rejects or overlooks the social dimension of moral reasoning, the chapter mentions the deficits that arise from social isolation of infant humans and monkeys. This last, however, is consistent with the view that social interaction is important for optimal development (and maintenance) of reasoning capacities, but that in adulthood optimal reasoning is nevertheless substantially individualistic. A subsequent discussion of apparent deficits in social skills in persons with autism or narcissistic personality disorder is likewise consistent with this last. Moreover, the observation that groups are practically needed in order to build up a body of knowledge is also consistent with optimal reasoning in isolation. The chapter's most compelling support for collaborativism comes from experiments in which collaborating pairs of individuals can solve a "turning gear" puzzle more effectively than can non-collaborating pairs. In fact, much of their argumentation supports the important role of the social in cognitive and moral reasoning without supporting a synchronic version of the view that one reasons best in groups.

As the name suggests, "Conceptual Development: The Case of Essentialism" (Susan A. Gelman and Elizabeth A. Ware) focuses on one facet of infant conceptual development: psychological essentialism. This is the view that concepts are structured with the presupposition that members of a category have an underlying cause or essence. So, for example, pre-school children believe that a tiger is a tiger in virtue of some (typically) non-perceptual "hidden" fixed, innate attribute that is informative about other features of being a tiger. This belief is explored by asking children questions regarding various hypothetical scenarios, as "What would happen to a tiger that grows up around horses?" Would it have stripes? Would it roar? In this field, there are important interactions with the themes of innateness and domain-specific modularity. The paper ultimately defends a version of essentialism according to which multiple domain-general capacities give rise to essentialist concepts.

"Evolutionary Psychology" (Ben Jeffares and Kim Sterelny) begins with a brief historical sketch tracing the impact of evolutionary thinking on the study of behavior and cognition. Two of the principal sections pit an evolutionary nativism against an evolutionary story that proposes that we have developed mechanisms that enable humans to learn from their culture. The nativist view proposes that humans succeed in so many difficult cognitive tasks, such as carrying on a conversation or managing social relationships, because they have evolved special purpose mental mechanisms for these tasks. While this sort of nativist evolutionary psychology has attracted the greatest amount of attention in recent years, this chapter resists this marriage of evolution and psychology on the grounds of the diversity of human environments. Given the evident diversity in family structures, economic bases, technologies, and physical environments, one-size-fits-all modules would not be likely to be adaptive. Instead, the chapter urges, we have evolved the capacity to structure our environments and to transmit an understanding of those structures to subsequent generations. The chapter includes some descriptions of ways in which fossil and archaeological evidence might be used to test evolutionary psychological hypotheses.

"Culture and Cognition" (Daniel M. T. Fessler and Edouard Machery) notes research traditions of seeking cross-cultural psychological universals (as might be due to homologies and canalization) and of seeking cross-cultural diversity (as might be due to variations in artifacts, environments, and practices). The mechanisms for culture acquisition might be either domain-specific or domain-general. Cognition also may influence culture by shaping the way in which cultural information is retained and transmitted.

"Experimental Philosophy" (Joshua Knobe) offers a supportive overview of the idea that cognitive science should study intuitions, not by consultation of personal intuitions, but with methods used elsewhere in cognitive science, methods such as the administration of survey instruments. It reviews some of the principal conclusions that have been advanced regarding cultural differences in knowledge attribution and reference, moral judgments, and moral responsibility. Such studies might be used to help clarify what intuitions people already have, hence set the stage for questions about the reliability of these intuitions. Alternatively, such studies might reveal that there is no unique fixed set of intuitions that merits philosophical attention, so that perhaps any project of studying intuitions for philosophical ends is misguided.


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