The Paradoxes of Art: A Phenomenological Investigation

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Alan Paskow, The Paradoxes of Art: A Phenomenological Investigation, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 272pp, $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521828333.

Reviewed by Sarah Worth, Furman University


Alan Paskow successfully defends an important thesis in this book -- that we need not view artworks as separate kinds of entities from other things in our world. Rather, drawing on Heidegger's Being in Time, Paskow shows that self and world are one relational being (88) and artworks and fictional characters are most effectively viewed as internal components of that world. More generally, Paskow takes on a daunting subject: what are the ways in which we interact with works of art? Although there is much historical background required to understand his ultimate thesis, Paskow puts forward the notion of a radically adjusted worldview in order to provide a context in which his thesis makes sense. The key for Paskow is to appeal to the worldview of the Dasein -- an integrated world, one which prefers the first-person phenomenological experience, and which is wholly anti-third-person and anti-Cartesian. As Paskow argues for this worldview, he develops a wonderful and coherent juxtaposition between historical and contemporary arguments and considers the question of our engagement with artworks from a number of different viewpoints. In the end I think that Paskow is successful in his endeavor to find a new perspective from which we can better make sense of our engagement with art. I worry, however, that in the process he may have taken us too far afield from ways that people actually think about the world and their interaction with it. He is also often too quick to dismiss some very important philosophical work in order to argue for the worldview that allows his position to make the most sense. In the end, however, I think he is successful in his endeavor and this book deserves high praise amongst a number of others that appeal to historical contexts in order to grapple with contemporary philosophical problems.

Paskow breaks his investigation into five chapters: The Reality of Fictional Beings, Things in Our World, Why and How Others Matter, Why and How Painting Matters, and For and Against Interpretation. Without summarizing what he does in each chapter I will try to get to the heart of his argument and review the essence of the ultimate conclusion he draws. His thesis is that we need not differentiate, epistemologically, ontologically, or metaphysically, between characters in paintings, fictional characters, and our own real loved ones in the way that we think about them, interact with them, or let them affect us emotionally. Paskow deals with the question of how we interact with fictional characters first and then moves to the way we interpret paintings. Since there is a wealth of literature on the ways in which we interact with fictional characters in narrative and literature, he builds his foundation there, ultimately using his argument against what the current analytic aestheticians argue.

His first big philosophical push is against the Paradox of Fiction, which is generated by the problem that we do not believe in the existence of fictional characters, but we often have emotional responses to them anyway, even though under normal circumstances we do not respond to things we do not believe have happened. Paskow claims that he is a "realist", saying that "we do take fictional characters to be … real" (43). After presenting the general problems the paradox arouses, Paskow goes into an extensive explanation of the various kinds of responses philosophers have generated in an attempt to resolve the paradox. This is significant since the position he takes on resolving the paradox is the same position he will develop to fruition throughout the book. He characterizes Walton's response to the paradox of fiction as simulationist -- of the kind that asserts "that we do not really have full-fledged or genuine emotions with respect to beings or events we think to be fictional" (41). Although I think Walton would take issue with this, and might characterize himself rather as a pretense theorist whose work intersects with simulation theory, Paskow forges ahead with a full-fledged attack (8 full pages) on Walton's work. Paskow says that Walton claims that "the beings of artworks are nothing more than creatures in our minds" (45). It seems unlikely to me that Walton would say this, and it is an un-cited mischaracterization of Walton's position. What I understand to be happening in this section is that Paskow is criticizing Walton, already assuming the position from which he wants to argue. That is, Paskow says he is a "realist" (fictional characters should be considered the same as real people) and is criticizing Walton from a realist's position. He acknowledges Walton's work only as a simple response to the paradox of fiction, not as a full-fledged theory of imagination, which is really what it is. Paskow invokes his own theory of imagination by calling for a new worldview, but in not acknowledging other theories of imagination, he does a disservice to Walton and a number of other aestheticians whom he criticizes in the process.

In his assessment of our emotional responses to fictional characters more generally, Paskow also does not acknowledge that under normal circumstances, in "real" situations, we need to believe what is said in order to respond appropriately. For instance, if someone said to me, "what I am about to say is not true: you have just won the lottery!", I would have no reason to be emotionally affected, because I do not believe that I have just won the lottery. I do not act even on the nice thought of what I would do if I won the lottery since I do not believe it to be the case. This is the real importance of the belief requirement in real situations. Conversely, if I did believe that I had won the lottery it would be strange if I did not respond with some excitement, and it would be justified for me to start spending money. Thus emotional responses happen when we believe something to be the case. We do not respond (with emotion or action) when we believe that the situation is merely fictional. Paskow criticizes Walton for saying that because there is no belief in our responses to fictional intentional objects there is no real fear. What Walton in fact argues, however, and he is often mischaracterized here, is that quasi-fear is a genuine emotion; it just is not the same thing as fear. Fear requires a belief that one is in some (real) danger. Quasi-fear looks and feels a lot like fear, but cannot be the same thing since it lacks the belief/action component. It is, nevertheless, a genuine emotion.

Paskow's brand of realism further allows him to say that fictional intentional objects need no differentiation from real intentional objects. He explains that Anna Karenina is to be taken "to be real in the same way that I take my daughter to be real," with some caveats (60). Paskow argues that Anna, his daughter who is overseas (who he cannot affect by thinking about her, just like with Anna) and his dead grandmother are all "metaphysically isolated" from him, but at the same time, he says, he is able to dwell with them and they are not merely images he conjures up in his mind (61). He still claims, however, that this is not a version of the thought theory which he criticizes. He argues further that these are examples of what he calls "incommercible historical events" (170). He explains that they are incommercible because we can have no 'commerce' or intercourse with [them]; we cannot affect [them] although [they] can affect us. Our orientation towards [them] is, therefore unidirectional and asymmetric" (170). They are all real in the same way. He explains that "what I am focusing on is not what another -- thus from a third-person point of view -- would say is 'really taking place' in me, but how I and anyone else as a first-person experiencer ordinarily relate to absent others, be they 'real' people or 'fictional' beings. He concludes that "we do think [the talented Mr.] Ripley exists (as a real person) and we are truly involved emotionally in his life" (62-3). This is because of what he calls a "dual cognition" (63). He says that our disbelief of fictional characters is "fairly inactive" when we really engage with them. So the fact that we disbelieve in fictional characters' existence is so far backgrounded that we deal with them in exactly the same way as we do with real others. The dual cognition is a form of foregrounding and backgrounding cognitive objects of awareness.

As he moves from fictional beings to real beings, Paskow appeals to further philosophically basic issues that underpin the rest of his arguments. After making his big claim about the way we deal with aesthetic objects (he does not, as far as I can tell, make an argument explaining why artworks and narrative fictions can be dealt with as though they are the same things), he moves to an attempt to elucidate the ways in which we characterize the phenomenological relationship with the world we inhabit. Here Paskow goes on an historical jaunt, calling forth both Hegel and Heidegger. He appeals to Heidegger's Dasein, suggesting the "the self and the world are not two discrete things, but instead, at the deepest level, one relational being" (88). Paskow says we "should not think of ourselves as beings who are in a world of ourselves by ourselves, but possessing or having a world" (88-9). We do not work only from a third-person perspective interacting with a world and people who are fundamentally separated from us, but we are in that world and we are part of it -- from an essentially first-person perspective.

Paskow's appeal to this very different worldview is the key to the genius of this book. For years, as Paskow points out, analytic aestheticians have framed the paradox of fiction, and more generally the questions dealing with our engagement and appreciation of artworks, from a standpoint either of linguistically framed referents or perhaps from the Cartesian worldview where everything is experienced from the third-person perspective. Extinguishing the "subject-object dichotomy or the representationalist picture of knowing" (85) allows for Paskow to eliminate a number of problems philosophers have had to face previously when dealing with these issues.

After historically contextualizing his realist position, Paskow moves to the interpretation of painting, away from the narrative fictions he dealt with in the earlier part of the book. The last two chapters are an application of the worldview that he set up in this first part. He explains that if "in an important sense we are able to see aspects of a painting, to experience them without an interpretive key, then perhaps it is precisely this feature of viewing a painting that calls for reinstatement and investigation" (159). He says that there are three basic modes of viewing: (1) an unreflective viewing that is both visual and affective, (2) a viewing which requires reflective effort on the part of the viewer, and (3) a viewing which involves "spectatorial consciousness" (160), which requires an evaluative effort to contextualize the artwork. Paskow spends the fourth chapter showing how the first two of these would work in reference to Vermeer's Woman Holding a Balance (1664). The last chapter is an example of a feminist, Marxist, and deconstructionist interpretation (or contextualization as per number three above) of the same painting. Paskow here appeals to Richard Wollheim's theory of painting, once again encouraging a duality, but one distinctively non-Cartesian. Paskow cites Wollheim as contending "that when we stand before a painting, our awareness is almost always 'two-folded, [involving] two aspects of a single experience': we know that we are viewing a picture with a flat surface, and we also and simultaneously see a depicted world" (165). It is these dual consciousnesses (consciousness1 and consciousness2 as Paskow describes them) that allow for the first two types of viewing. He suggests that in consciousness1, what we do is look at the painting as though it were a photograph "for then we will be more inclined to think of the [subject] as being or having been 'real' in the ordinary sense of the word" (169). It is almost as if he suggests that we just blur our own vision so that we can make ourselves imagine that we are looking in on a real situation, which would make holding his realist argument more tenable. Consciousness2 allows us to think about and reflect on our foray into the world of the painting. "Appropriately inhabited," Paskow argues, "the different features of the [subject's] world become our world." Thus once again making the world of the artwork our own, allowing realism to reign true.

Overall, Paskow's book is lucid and well written. It is nice to see an analytic philosopher borrow from the continental tradition so effectively. I suspect most of us tend not to stray too far into their conceptual camps. I do regret that Paskow's claims were so damning of the analytic tradition in aesthetics and the culture of the Cartesian worldview. I think the book could have been done with more kindness given to his own tradition. However, the book remains an important contribution to the literature on our engagement with art.