The Paradoxical Rationality of Søren Kierkegaard

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Richard McCombs, The Paradoxical Rationality of Søren Kierkegaard, Indiana University Press, 2013, 244pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253006479.

Reviewed by Antony Aumann, Northern Michigan University


Søren Kierkegaard (1813-1855) has often been cast as an irrationalist -- an enemy of reason, logic, and perhaps even truth. It is easy to see why. Some of his works encourage us to "crucify" our understanding or to take a leap of faith beyond the evidence.[1] We also encounter texts suggesting that passionate beliefs are more important than true ones.[2] Perhaps his most frequently read book, Fear and Trembling, lauds Abraham for following God's commands "by virtue of the absurd."[3] Finally, a number of passages encourage us to accept "the absolute paradox" or "the contradiction" of the God-man, Jesus Christ.[4]

Richard McCombs joins a growing chorus of scholars who reject this view. Indeed, there is something approaching a consensus among specialists that Kierkegaard is not as irrational as he appears. What sets McCombs apart is that he also defends a more ambitious thesis. In addition to downplaying the irrationality of Kierkegaard, he maintains that Kierkegaard is actually a "robustly rational thinker" (7).

The strength of McCombs's book is its proximity to the primary texts. McCombs has a mastery of Kierkegaard's corpus, and many of his interpretations are original. This point of excellence, however, is tempered by the weakness of McCombs's arguments for his central claims. It is further dulled by McCombs's decision not to engage with the existing secondary literature. Thus, his book is somewhat of a mixed bag.

Structurally speaking, the book revolves around Kierkegaard's controversial and elusive notion of subjectivity. The first two chapters set forth McCombs's initial account of the concept. They also contain his explanation of why subjectivity is not merely rational but a "paradoxical" kind of rationality -- a claim that makes its way into the title of the book. Chapter 3 discusses why, according to Kierkegaard, we cannot become subjective entirely under our own power. In Chapters 4 and 5, McCombs offers an interpretation of Kierkegaard's instructions for how we might nonetheless try to become subjective and his strategies for encouraging us to do so. Chapters 6 and 7 contain an extended reading of Philosophical Fragments in which McCombs argues that Kierkegaard depicts Socrates as an exemplar of subjectivity in order to inspire readers to become subjective. Chapter 8 defends the thesis that subjectivity is necessary for knowledge, especially knowledge of God.

One major problem is that McCombs does not give us a straightforward definition or a systematic account of subjectivity. He offers us bits and pieces of his interpretation as he goes along. This procedure has the virtue of mirroring Kierkegaard's own fragmentary approach. But it comes at the cost of consistency and coherence.

For example, in some passages, subjectivity comes across as a relatively stripped down or minimalist concept. It seems to refer merely to the process of passionately striving to live out one's own ideals -- whatever they happen to be (3, 155). In fact, McCombs asserts that "practicing what one has understood with wonderful consistency and with rare integrity is the very definition of subjectivity" (140).

In other passages, subjectivity appears to be a much thicker or more robust concept. For instance, at various points McCombs asserts that subjectivity can only take certain kinds of ideals. These ideals must be morally good ones (35), since "striving to become good is at the very core of subjectivity" (13). In addition, they cannot be finite or worldly in nature (155). Finally, they must revolve around "the search for truth" (40) because "subjectivity is precisely a striving to turn the whole soul toward truth" (201).

McCombs also attributes specific beliefs and attitudes to people who possess subjectivity. He maintains that they will be skeptics of a sort. They will "assert . . . it is questionable whether they can ever grasp or comprehend the infinite and eternal ideal" (71). He adds that they will have "an interest in eternal happiness" (140) as well as "zeal for the human and . . . love for the divine" (141).

The equivocal nature of McCombs's account of subjectivity damages his defense of the rationality of Kierkegaard. For his arguments work only if he constantly shifts back and forth between different ways of thinking about the concept. I will look at three examples.

First, McCombs states that subjectivity is a kind of rationality because it has to do with consistency (3, 19). This claim is plausible on the minimalist sense of subjectivity. Indeed, if subjectivity just is the consistency of thought and action, then it closely resembles what we often call practical rationality (3). McCombs's claim is dubious, however, on a robust sense of subjectivity. If subjectivity revolves around loving the divine (141) or pursuing one's eternal happiness (140), it is no longer simply a matter of conforming one's actions to one's thoughts. And so its resemblance to practical rationality diminishes.

Second, McCombs says that subjectivity is rational because it involves the use of reason (3, 63, 77). This argument will not work on the minimalist sense of subjectivity. There are ways to live out one's ideals that do not require rational deliberation. For instance, a person might possess a refined sense of moral perception that allows him or her to see what to do without having to think about it. Thus, to make the line of thought here, McCombs switches to a robust sense of subjectivity that includes reflection as a constituent part (103).

Third, in Chapter 8, McCombs argues that subjectivity is rational because it contributes to the goal of theoretical reason, namely grasping the truth. This argument also will not work on the minimalist sense of subjectivity, since someone could live out ideals that are antithetical to the truth. Accordingly, in the relevant sections, McCombs relies on a robust sense of subjectivity that is intimately bound up with pursuit of the moral good. With this interpretation in hand, it make sense for him to say that becoming subjective involves cultivating moral virtues such as honesty, and that these virtues enhance our ability to know the truth (192-95).

In addition to the ambitious positive project of establishing the rationality of Kierkegaard, McCombs has a more modest negative project. He hopes to show that even if not rational, Kierkegaard is at least not as irrational as he appears (7). The challenge here is to accommodate passages in which Kierkegaard speaks negatively about reason. To do so, McCombs adopts a strategy that has become increasingly popular in the secondary literature. He maintains that we should not take these problematic passages at face value (2). He offers two main arguments for this view.

First, McCombs claims that Kierkegaard purposefully distorts and exaggerates his position. He pretends to be against reason when he is not and to be vehemently against it when his objections are only minor (20-23).

There is something to this interpretation. Kierkegaard explicitly admits that he offers his readers a "corrective." He emphasizes the opposite extreme of their natural tendency in order to bring them to the virtuous mean.[5] Yet, it is easy to make too much of these comments. When Kierkegaard discusses his use of the corrective strategy, he is speaking primarily about his response to Lutheranism's one-sided emphasis on grace over works. It is unclear whether he saw himself applying it in other contexts.

Moreover, we should be wary of those, such as McCombs, who wish to read Kierkegaard's entire authorship through the lens of correctives. This hermeneutic provides them with an all too easy way out of difficult interpretive problems. It allows them to dismiss as exaggerations any passages that conflict with their views. In McCombs's case, it even enables him to say that Kierkegaard's overt rejection of an idea is evidence that he supports it to some degree (151-52).

Second, McCombs argues that many of the passages in which Kierkegaard adopts a negative stance toward reason are not about the topics they overtly address. In some cases, quite astonishingly, they have nothing to do with reason or rationality at all. For example, in Chapter 3, McCombs claims that Kierkegaard's negative theology is not, as it might appear, about the limits of our ability to grasp the nature of God. Rather, it is about our inability to enact religious ideals. In Chapter 7, McCombs says that the discussion in Philosophical Fragments about how Socrates wills the downfall of his understanding is actually about how Socrates acknowledges his own sinful nature.

One particularly troubling example of this general approach occurs in Chapter 2. Here McCombs addresses Kierkegaard's well-known attacks on objective reasoning. It quickly becomes clear that these attacks have nothing to do with what ordinarily falls under this heading. They actually target a specific sort of person that McCombs calls an "objective thinker" (34-36). This reading would make sense, except that objective thinkers turn out to be very strange individuals. In fact, they are so bizarre and extreme one wonders whether any have ever existed. For instance, according to McCombs, objective thinkers only engage in abstract reflection and never pause to apply it to their lives (34). In fact, they never undertake any ethical or religious activity, but rather use deliberation to postpone it indefinitely (38-40). Finally, objective thinkers make an idol of logical reasoning and deny the possibility of acquiring information from other sources (58-59).

Interpreting Kierkegaard's criticisms of objective reasoning in this fashion may serve McCombs's goal of making Kierkegaard sound friendly to rationality. But it does so at the cost of diminishing Kierkegaard's philosophical significance. Almost no one -- not even Hegel -- would honestly defend the pattern of behavior McCombs attributes to the objective thinker. And its defects are so obvious that few people need to be told what they are.

My final concern is that McCombs does not engage with the secondary literature. With few exceptions, all references to and discussions of the work of others is confined to a limited number of endnotes. Of course, ignoring existing scholarship can be a good thing. It can allow one to cut a new path through old terrain. But, in McCombs's case, it is a defect. His neglect of the secondary literature hinders rather than helps his project.

One example is his failure to engage with the work of Robert Adams and Louis Pojman. Both interpret Kierkegaard as presenting forceful philosophical arguments against the use of objective reasoning when it comes to religious matters.[6] McCombs's attempt to defend the idea that Kierkegaard is friendly to reason would be enhanced if he grappled with their views. Another example is the recent scholarship on Kierkegaard's concept of subjectivity by Jamie Ferreira and Patrick Stokes.[7] They provide considerable support for the idea that subjectivity does not involve reflection or deliberation. It is rather a kind of mental vision that allows one to see the salient aspects of a situation without overtly thinking about them. Ferreira and Stokes's interpretation creates problems for the idea that subjectivity is a kind of rationality, which would seem to entail that subjectivity is bound up with deliberation. McCombs's book would have acquired a needed layer of complexity if he had responded to this challenge.

In conclusion, The Paradoxical Rationality of Søren Kierkegaard focuses on an interesting and important topic. Its thesis that Kierkegaard is "a robustly rational thinker" is exciting and worthy of pursuit. Yet, the defects in McCombs's arguments and his lack of engagement with other scholarship entail that the book does not have as much to offer as it might.

[1] Søren Kierkegaard, Concluding Unscientific Postscript to "Philosophical Fragments," trans. Howard V. Hong and Edna H. Hong, vol. 1, Kierkegaard's Writings XII.1 (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1992), 98-106, 559.

[2] Søren Kierkegaard, Concluding Unscientific Postscript, 1:201.

[3] Søren Kierkegaard, Fear and Trembling, trans. Howard V. Hong and Edna H. Hong, Kierkegaard's Writings 6 (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1983), 56-57.

[4] For example, Kierkegaard, Concluding Unscientific Postscript, 1:561-562; Søren Kierkegaard, Practice in Christianity, Kierkegaard's Writings 20 (Princeton University Press, 1991), 135-136.

[5] For example, Søren Kierkegaard, Søren Kierkegaard's Journals and Papers, trans. Howard V. Hong, Edna H. Hong, and Gregor Malantschuk, 7 vols. (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 1967-1978), sec. 1.707-711, 6.6467, 6.6693.

[6] Robert Merrihew Adams, "Kierkegaard's Arguments Against Objective Reasoning in Religion," The Monist 60, no. 2 (1977): 228-243; Louis P. Pojman, The Logic of Subjectivity: Kierkegaard's Philosophy of Religion (Tuscaloosa, AL: University of Alabama Press, 1984).

[7] M. Jamie Ferreira, Transforming Vision: Imagination and Will in Kierkegaardian Faith (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1991); Patrick Stokes, Kierkegaard's Mirrors: Interest, Self and Moral Vision (New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2009).