The Passion of Infinity: Kierkegaard, Aristotle and the Rebirth of Tragedy

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Daniel Greenspan, The Passion of Infinity: Kierkegaard, Aristotle and the Rebirth of Tragedy, Walter de Gruyter, 2008, 336pp., $136.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783110203967.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Bloechl, Boston College



Among nineteenth century philosophers taking an interest in Greek tragedy, we are most likely to think of Friedrich Nietzsche, whose Birth of Tragedy from the Spirit of Music (1872) withstood early scorn on its way to becoming a classic in twentieth century letters. Nietzsche’s vision is well known: with the arrival in Greece of the cult of Dionysus, art that had hitherto been concerned only with appearances submitted to quiet observation became capable of evoking in the observer a frenzied sense of life otherwise occluded by the play of forms. Dionysian ecstasy, in other words, is the antecedent of an art that consumes the distance between observer and observed, an art that is no longer merely submitted to our consideration but instead takes possession of us. Nietzsche does not hesitate to find in the religious import of Dionysus a confirmation of the importance of this new art: just as the practices of the cult conduct the participant beyond the simple limits of individuality, so too does contact with certain works of art free us from the coil of our mortality. Of these works of art, Greek tragedy — specifically until Euripides — is supreme. It is the achievement of Aeschylus and Sophocles to have invested the Apollonian craft of appearance with the Dionysian fire of vitality, and the promise of their craft to have provided spectators with a temporary relief from the suffering that accrues to finite, death-bound existence. And yet the achievement no less quickly succumbed to the advances of a Socratic insistence on knowledge and truth, which Euripides introduced into the theater itself. In short, tragedy was born and fell ill within the bare century that separates the flourishing of Aeschylus and that of Euripides, and western culture has fallen slowly into the decadence at last recognized by Nietzsche.

Daniel Greenspan’s The Passion of Infinity: Kierkegaard, Aristotle and the Rebirth of Tragedy reminds us that Kierkegaard had already taken a quite different view of some of these matters three decades earlier, chiefly in some works of his so-called “first authorship” (1841-1846). In the order of Greenspan’s presentation, these include Either/Or, Stages on Life’s Way, Fear and Trembling, and The Concept of Anxiety. Well over half of the book — chapters 6-12 — develops a reading of these works, followed by shorter discussions of a few others, all on the matter of a suppression and reemergence of certain elements of tragedy. As one might expect, Kierkegaard’s interest in Greek tragedy is complex. His focal point, as Greenspan develops it, is the interplay of freedom and fate, or more specifically the tragedian’s attention to the manner in which fate may assert itself in the eruption of passions that overwhelm our freedom. From a great distance, this resembles something that Kierkegaard finds in the biblical accounts of Abraham or Job, both of whom, we ought not to forget, he reads decidedly in the service of efforts to awaken authentic Christianity from a deadening lethargy. Of course, there is a great difference between Greek tragedy and the Jewish bible, indeed even when interpreted by a single author with famously singular concerns. So how then might these things be squared?

As it turns out, Kierkegaard’s understanding of the place and function of Greek tragedy in western culture resembles Nietzsche’s, but with at least three crucial differences. First, while the importance of tragedy does lie in its manner of representing and even provoking an experience that escapes the ordinary limits of human finitude, there can be no question of reducing the religious dimensions of the experience to an archaic, undifferentiated vitality. Kierkegaard is more prepared than Nietzsche to count among the essential elements of the experience the tragedians’ appeal to the gods. Applying himself directly to Sophocles’s text, Greenspan cites with approval E. R. Dodds’s admirably formulaic definition of the Greek atē whereby the daimon delivers Oedipus to the authority of the divine: it is a matter, says Dodds, of “an exteriority that operates from within” (36, citing Dodds, The Greeks and the Irrational). For Kierkegaard, we know, the only true exteriority is that of the divine Other, and so in his view the tragedian is right to insist on the presence of the gods even if that vision is later to be superseded by monotheism. Second, while Kierkegaard agrees that something important was lost as tragedy went into decline, he neither envisions nor desires a simple return of what was lost, but instead foresees its return in the improved form of Christian life. In other words, what Kierkegaard appreciates in tragedy — its promotion of passion, as the milieu of the free individual’s encounter with fate — reemerges, and in a more authentic form, in the vital Christianity that he himself advocates throughout his authorship. Naturally, this raises the difficult question of just what tragedy and Christianity truly have in common, especially in view of the fact that, at least according to Kierkegaard, their original forms are separated (mediated?) by Greek philosophy. And thirdly, then, for Kierkegaard, Greenspan tells us, the villain in all of this is neither Euripides nor even Socrates before him, but Aristotle.

Let us consider Greenspan’s case for this third point, before considering what he might offer us concerning the relation of Christianity and tragedy. Prompted by Derrida’s references to a “”SpellE">symptomatology" of fear and trembling and his suggestion that this is what Kierkegaard has in mind (The Gift of Death, p. 55), Greenspan proposes to “restore both the archaic mystery of emotion and its cognitive significance” (1) such as Greek philosophy proved finally incapable of recognizing. The trembling, shortness of breath, and tears we associate with Abraham or Job are not extraneous to the experiences that draw us to them, but belong to a corporeal dimension without which those experiences would be something else entirely. However, Greenspan’s interest is not immediately with biblical experience, but instead the Greek world in which tragedy did for a time present us with a rich expression of emotional life before the rationalistic proclivities of the philosophers eventually occluded it. And so Greenspan begins with a chapter on Sophocles’s Oedipus, even though Kierkegaard himself tends to treat that play as little more than a preface to Antigone (see “The Ancient ”SpellE">Tragical Motif," in Either/Or). In a basic sense, Greenspan’s interest is quite classical: he wishes to understand the strange sort of knowing that comes to Oedipus in the dawning of his realization that he has unwittingly committed both patricide and incest. Of the many ways to approach this realization, Greenspan focuses on two: the play of different forms of seeing and blindness, and Oedipus’s fall from quasi-divine status to mortal humiliation and exile. Oedipus’s fall is also a conversion from a commitment to his own rational capacities to a new kind of reasoning that has at its center an attunement to impenetrable mystery and thus also an awareness of its own ignorance (14).

Whether or not this may be generally amenable to what is sometimes called Socrates’s epistemic humility, Greenspan concerns himself especially with the treatment that tragedy receives in Aristotle’s Poetics. His guiding thread is the question of sickness and healing, though not immediately with respect to the purgative effects of tragedy that Aristotle famously highlights. What about Oedipus himself? Pollution, let us remember, afflicts Thebes as the drama begins, and it descends on — or reveals its presence in - Oedipus as the drama ends. Yet as even the simplest reader notices, none of this is strictly deserved, and by all accounts Oedipus is of sound mind and gentle spirit. Why, then, is he not committed immediately to the ritual purification instead of punishment (23)? According to Greenspan, Aristotle came to terms with this difficulty chiefly by shifting perspective to a more embracing look at the entire play, which appears as an artful depiction of the disclosure of reason by way of what is evidently an irrational disaster. And this, moreover, is in keeping with the moral psychology by which Aristotle distinguishes between the personal psuchê that is bound to the body and subject to akrasia, and the impersonal nous bound to reason. Whereas for the tragedian, the disorder in the soul of Oedipus signaled the intervention of the gods, as avatars of fate, Aristotle prefers to think of that disorder more simply as a fall into the irrational, and whereas the tragedian suggests the birth of a “third wisdom” that is neither reason nor a lack of reason, Aristotle looks toward the realization of a “well-being” (eudaimonia) that has gotten free of the calamities of akrasia (126-134). Precisely where the tragedian presents us with daimonic madness, the philosopher proposes a moral psychology in which excellence coincides with order and the ideal of harmony. If for Aristotle tragedy makes any contribution to human flourishing, it is to be found in the manner in which its turbulence calms the soul, and not in any celebration of the turbulence itself. It is at this moment that a positive notion of body, as seat of the emotional life, goes underground.

There is far more in these reflections on Ancient Greece than can be developed here. The discussion of Greece makes up just less than the first half of Greenspan’s book. The remainder is dedicated to Kierkegaard, who seeks a rebirth of tragedy in a present age no longer susceptible to the power of the irrational. At least the Greeks, including Aristotle, feared it and in that sense maintained a palpable respect for it. Modern Europeans, Kierkegaard tells us, find themselves mired in a subjectivity at once overly committed to its own rational capacities and prey to a debilitating guilt (146, 190). Many of what are likely to be Kierkegaard’s most familiar themes are anchored here, in a revolt against the easy notion that individuality is defined by reason and history or sustained by society and its institutions. True individuality is secured in a relation with the One God, and all that can save the soul that does not know this is an encounter with that God.

Perhaps this is already enough for it to become clear just how it is that a thinker of such deep Christian inspiration can turn with forceful interest to Greek tragedy. At stake is an insistence that human beings are first and finally impassioned beings, both historically and of course essentially. But if this is too bold, then at least it puts us on the track of what Greenspan judges to be Kierkegaard’s real difficulty with Greek philosophy, as epitomized in Aristotle: the subjectivity of the subject is neither a product nor even a function of the movement of reflection. We may safely leave aside the anti-Hegelian overtones of this relationship to Greek philosophy, and instead observe, following Greenspan, that Kierkegaard extends it over his relationship even to the whole of tragedy, whether Greek or modern. With regard, for instance, to Antigone this means realizing that her tragedy consists in the impossibility of an entire range of choices, all of which will destroy her (154-155). On this point, Greek tragedy did not fully understand itself, since it had not yet realized this concentration on individual action and choice. But then if it is the achievement of modernity to have grasped this, the limits of the modern show up in an incapacity to think beyond what is still only an ethical problem toward its only workable solution, if one can call it that, in the religious. Modern tragedy is tragedy of interiority, of moral conscience, which however is an inheritance of the Christian relation to God that intervenes between ancient Greece and modern Denmark. Kierkegaard proposes to awaken that modernity to its proper identity. Again, this will consist to a significant degree in a revitalization of our sense of the passions which, seated in the body but attuned to the One God, define human beings as religious beings before and outside any question of rational justification.

As one might expect, this carries Kierkegaard, and indeed Greenspan’s interpretation of Kierkegaard, into some reflection on biblical experience. These passages of the book, roughly the last three chapters, contain a great deal of material that is likely to be familiar to most readers of Kierkegaard. In Fear and Trembling, the juxtaposition of Abraham with Agamemnon brings out the profound absurdity of Abraham’s willingness to sacrifice Isaac, and signals - in what, in the present context, amounts to a final rejection of Aristotle — the inadequacy of any teleology when confronted with the religious dimension of human being. Abraham’s fearful respiration and his trembling gestures are the corporeal expression of a faith for which there can be no rational ground, and as such form the contours of a way of being unknown to either Greek philosophy or modern culture. So too are Job’s staggered gait and his tears fundamentally impassioned and religious. At their root is a surrender to the One God, the Divine from whom alone may come a grace and mercy that is, like the surrender itself, incomprehensible so long as one insists on a rationality that claims ascendancy over passion (287). In this much, living faith appears here as the positive completion of insights that are first set forth in tragedy, provided their proper horizon in Christianity, and then forgotten by the modernity that claims to supplant Christianity. For Kierkegaard, we know, Christian faith is not for the faint at heart. Belief weathers, even lives from recurrent anxiety and the more prolonged trials of despair, by which one may find oneself truly as oneself, which is to say standing alone before God.

Greenspan’s The Passion of Infinity is remarkably learned for a scholar’s first book (it is in fact a modified version of his doctoral dissertation). Sophocles, Aristotle and Kierkegaard are all interpreted with a good understanding of their original languages and in sophisticated discussion with a wide range of established scholars of all three authors, and indeed of Ancient Greece and 19th century Europe. There are also occasional helpful references to contemporary philosophy. I have already mentioned Derrida, but some features of Foucault’s later philosophy are also invoked at interesting moments, and as one may expect Freud is cited often. That said, Greenspan’s defense of such a closely defined thesis does sometimes, no doubt inevitably, appear to overlook certain complications: Would it make a difference for Greenspan’s argument if he were to continue from Oedipus Tyrannus, with its concentration on the fall of the protagonist, into Oedipus at Colonus, where redemption is rather more at the center of Sophocles’s reflections? Are the implications for Christianity and modernity limited by the fact that Kierkegaard’s sense of the former is distinctly Protestant and his experience of the former in fact quite local? The persistence of these questions makes it unfortunate that Greenspan leaves largely undeveloped the “phenomenology of emotional life” invoked at the beginning of the book, eschewing — or perhaps only postponing — a robust account of body and emotion in the religious definitions that this book assigns them, in favor of suggestions that religious passion is embodied in the poetic writing of someone very like Kierkegaard himself (311). One is inclined to accept this as a characterization of the author of Fear and Trembling or The Concept of Anxiety. But it would be mightily disappointing to find that religious passion can be described only there, in the evidence of such an extravagant form of life. Indeed, it counts among the book’s most impressive achievements to have given us good reason to suspect that this can hardly be the case.