What do we want from political philosophy now? The fundamental enterprise of the discipline over the past half century seems to have been normative reassurance: providing vindication of universally binding ethical first principles as they apply to the basic structures regulating human interaction. One patent cost of philosophically securing reassurance has been the methodological necessity of abstracting the political subject from the concrete institutions in fact constitutive of modern life in general: the nuclear family, the capitalist market, and the liberal state. But what if not just the social identity of the modern subject is constituted through these three forms of social practice, but the ethico-political ambitions and meaning of moral modernity are themselves somehow congealed in the way in which these core institutions are articulated with one another? What if the joining of deontology and methodological individualism simultaneously obscures and deforms both the ethical contours of modernity and the way we as modern subjects live out our commitments? What if the methodological orientations of political philosophy in providing normative reassurance effectively alienate us from political reality? According to Axel Honneth, a fierce version of this thought is a premise of Hegel’s social theory.
Given its emphatic binding of categorial self-reflection to social reality, Hegel’s Philosophy of Right (PR) has had a surprisingly insignificant effect on the politico-philosophical self-understanding of the present. Honneth avers that the most evident reasons for this lack of influence are, first, the belief that PR’s apparent subordination of the freedom of the individual to the state has antidemocratic consequences; and second, the belief that the structure of Hegel’s argument is bound to the conceptual apparatus of his Logic with its commitment to an ontological concept of spirit.1 Although running the risk of sacrificing what might be the true substance of PR for the sake of a stripped down reconstruction, Honneth’s own commitment to what he terms “our own post-metaphysical standards of rationality” (5) leads him to adopt a method of indirect reactualization. Honneth is concerned with unearthing and validating the deep structures of Hegel’s argument through which he is able to reposition the atomistic assumptions of social contract theory as practiced by Locke, Kant, and Fichte by folding them back into the dominant institutions of modern life, “those spheres of reciprocal recognition that must be preserved intact because they constitute the moral identity of modern societies” (5).
Terming the dominant institutions “spheres of reciprocal recognition” turns Hegel’s project into the forerunner to Honneth’s own pioneering study, The Struggle for Recognition: The Moral Grammar of Social Conflicts (1995). Yet, and here is the hermeneutical rub, the theory of recognition does not transparently play the same formative role in PR as it does in Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit. Honneth’s philosophical gamble is thus to see if, by adopting an arm’s length approach to Hegel’s text its core argument can be reconstructed along recognitive lines.
In opposition to classical political philosophy, Hegel contends there are three irreducible models of free will that are both theoretically available and empirically actual in social practice; all three are necessary for a complete concept of free will and thus for freedom to become socially actual. Honneth labels these the “negative,” the “optional,” and the “communicative” notions of freedom, which correspond respectively to the three parts of PR: “Abstract Right,” “Morality,” and “Ethical Life.” What is invaluable in the negative concept of free will is the ability of the subject to distance itself from all needs, desires, and drives; this freedom from all given purposes and restrictions is realized in the human capacity for suicide. While freedom from all restrictive ends is a sublime human power, it is also empty since all choice involves the positing of some restrictive purpose. The optional model, as espoused by Kant and Fichte, goes a step further in identifying the power of free will as the capacity to choose among desires and inclinations in accordance with the demands of moral law.
It is worth noting that the highly abstract and formal character of the negative and optional models of free will naturally converges with the methodological abstractions of the practice of normative reassurance. If freedom of the will is characteristic of modern subjectivity in its moral and political self-understanding, then political philosophy can only become realist, to employ Raymond Geuss’s term of art, by discovering and elaborating a model of freedom in which actuality precedes possibility, that is, a model in which freedom as realized in concrete acts or practices will count as the fulfillment of freedom, stranding as mere possibilities the power or capacity to engage in such actions or practices. In this respect the project of reactualizing PR turns on the success of the critique of Kant’s model of autonomy.
Hegel’s fundamental critique begins with a concern over Kant’s moral metaphysics with its rigid duality between duty and inclination, itself a moral version of the transcendental divide forever separating a (noumenal) realm of freedom and reason from a (phenomenal) realm determined by causal laws. In this setting, humans can determine which inclinations they act on — that is what is “optional” — but the whole realm of needs, desires, and inclinations remain natural givens outside the reach of emphatic rational reformation. This is prima facie implausible: even if some remnants of natural determination remain untouched by processes of education and socialization, the thick texture of human social practices that are continuously realized through the coordinated system of socialized desires and motivations presumes the intrinsic social malleability of the system of motivations whereby social content is given to in-built affective structures (e.g., fearing a hostile take over) and new motivations created (e.g., the desire to set an elegant table).
This opens the door to what can be called the “Schiller Thesis”: not only must subjects possess sufficient motivational resources to be able to translate moral decisions into practical motives, but the perception of inclinations as opposing and so restricting moral freedom may itself be overcome through the project of transforming into “the stuff of freedom … the whole system of human impulses” (12-13). Once freedom is regarded as capable of being fully integrated into the motivational system, then freedom can be realized only if the affective inclinations bearing it are satisfied. Honneth instances a minor passage in the addition to § 7 to provide the key to his interpretation.
But we already possess this freedom in the form of feeling, for example in friendship and love. Here, we are not one-sidedly within ourselves, but willingly limit ourselves with reference to an other, even while knowing ourselves in this limitation as ourselves. In this determinacy, the human being should not feel determined; on the contrary, he attains his self-awareness only by regarding the other as other. Thus, freedom lies neither indeterminacy nor in determinacy, but is both at once.2
Friendship (or love) models the idea of communicative freedom, which in turn models Honneth’s understanding of the significance of “Ethical Life.” In friendship the optional and negative notions of freedom are synthesized: subjects determine themselves to a specific end or aim, but in satisfying their desire for freedom in this way they each acquire an “unrestricted experience of self” (14) — in acts of friendship I keep finding myself returned to myself expanded, the “we” together possessing more of me than I would alone. Communicative freedom is thus a version of reciprocal recognition in which self-realization occurs through participation in appropriate modes of intersubjective interaction.
Even if one acknowledges motivational malleability, one might still view the deep structures of human desire and motivation as antithetical to moral demands. What then is the critique of Kant that would yield the necessity of communicative freedom and so ethical life more broadly as its upshot? Honneth contends that only the “context-blindness” objection is successful: "in trying to apply the categorical imperative, the subject will remain disoriented and “empty” so long as he does not resort to certain normative guidelines drawn from the institutionalized practices of his environment, which provide him with the most basic information about what may be regarded as a “good” reason in any situation" (39). This can be looked at from two directions: if one fails to account for the predetermined lay-out of social reality, then the categorical imperative has nothing to latch onto in order to provide it with determinacy (e.g., it is the norms governing loans as opposed to gifts that guide one in knowing what to return when and how; without them the obligation to return or reciprocate is meaningless); conversely, once moral deliberation is governed by the institutionalized practices of a social environment, the categorical imperative “loses its justificatory function” (40).
The either “empty” or “unnecessary” diagnosis of Kantian morality points to four theses. First, the primary theorem of Hegel’s social ontology is revealed as the claim that we must “understand reality as the embodiment of reason” (40); the practices and institutions composing our social world must now be construed as already saturated by those rational norms that have proven over time to be necessary for its reproduction through the actions of individuals who are capable of finding themselves realized and satisfied through their participation in them. This is in effect what Hegel means by the notion of “objective spirit.” Second, from the point of view of objective spirit, the categorical imperative and the related apparatus of Kant’s moral theory are best understood as what emerge from moments of radical social breakdown, from moments when the “will no longer finds itself in the duties recognized in this world and must seek to recover in ideal inwardness alone that harmony which it has lost in actuality” (PR, § 138).
Third, given the claim for the rational coherence of social reality, there follows a strong “damage” thesis, namely, “an offence against those rational grounds with which our social practices are interlinked at any given moment will cause damage or injury in social reality” (6), where by “damage or injury” Honneth intends both some form of otherwise unnecessary social suffering as well as the corresponding deformation to the practice itself. Notice that the damage thesis will operate with equal force with respect to actions premised on a theoretical misunderstanding of social reality, and with respect to actions that simply transgress the practical norms composing a given practice. From the point of view of objective spirit, these are equal. Thus, if modern ethical life really is composed of the three institutions of family, civil society (capitalist market economy), and the state, and these three jointly provide the necessary conditions for the actuality of human freedom, then now attempting to act solely on the basis of the categorical imperative will be socially distorting and personally damaging. Thus, four, “Abstract Right” and “Morality” as comprising effective social points view become forms of social pathology when taken as operating in isolation from the whole of which they are mere reflective parts. Agents committed to these one-sided and partial perspectives will be unable to realize their autonomy, and further will remain “imprisoned in a painful condition of unfulfillment and indeterminacy” (45). While some of the exorbitances of romanticism can be regarded as one version of this suffering, perhaps the fierce anger and social alienation of those who identify with the Tea Party movement is another.
In Chapter III, “The Theory of Ethical Life as a Normative Theory of Modernity,” Honneth seeks to demonstrate how the dominant institutions of modern life are reconstructed by Hegel so as to display an articulation of the friendship model of communicative freedom. Participation in these institutions is a liberation from the “suffering from indeterminacy” that besets negative and optional freedom, and, positively, offers an experience of substantial freedom. Such liberation requires a radical transformation in the self-understanding of the agent such that individual self-realization can be experienced affectively and cognitively as occurring through modes of interaction, modes of “being oneself in other.” The central institutions of modern society thus must be taken to “represent the only areas of practice in which self-realization, recognition, and education work together in the requisite manner” (57). Jointly these institutions elaborate the necessary conditions for the actuality of freedom in the modern world. Pressing sideways on Hegel’s obscure claim that "Right is any existence in general which is the existence of the free will" (PR, § 29), Honneth states that rights “cover all those social conditions that can be proved to be necessary for the realization of the ‘free will’ of every subject” (16). This is obscure: spheres of practice have no “right” to existence because they secure a good whose existence they bring into being, nor can a sphere of practice give a subject outside that sphere a right to have the rights it bestows because without participation in it she would lack something she needs in order to actualize her freedom. Robert Pippin has nicely voiced this criticism of Honneth: “A common ethical life cannot be understood as the object of a rights or general entitlement claim if that life amounts to a necessary pre-condition of the determinate meaning and binding force of such a rights claim.”3
When Fichte argues for a transcendental conception of right as providing the minimum necessary conditions for freedom, he has in mind the rights that any subject must have in any possible society in order to be recognized as a rational agent. Necessary conditions get their leverage from what their absence signifies; in this case, lacking the conditions for agency altogether. The idea of stipulating necessary conditions for self-realization attaches a minimum requirement to a maximum goal. This entails that “necessity” and “right” are unhinged in Honneth’s argument. Of course, Hegel does suppose that we become endowed with certain rights through participation in particular institutions, and, retrospectively we can recognize that possession of those rights gives us something necessary for our freedom that we would lack without them. The necessity in this way of expressing the thought is weak since it says no more than that the good reasons for participating in a practice are only available from inside the practice. And while Hegel does think this, it is much weaker than his linking of “right” and “necessity” with some idea of the realization of free will requires.
This yields a deep puzzle about the structure of Honneth’s argument. The puzzle is easy to state: Hegel is patently committed to providing a conception of freedom that expands the Schiller thesis binding inclination and duty in an intersubjective and finally social direction; hence, to demonstrating that participating in family, market and the state one is given forms of freedom in which others appear not as limits but as conditions of possibility while nonetheless enabling a strong, uniquely modern conception of individuality. Conceiving of the spheres of ethical life in recognitive terms provides a first, essential step in displacing the organicist language Hegel employs to depict the kind of unity present in ethical life. But neither Honneth’s interpretation of Hegel’s own theory of the state as functionally securing the other spheres of ethical life by providing them with the “durability, reliability, and implementability that was necessary to make them a condition of freedom” (69), nor his own account in which the final sphere would comprise different forms of “public freedom” (77) — however desirable public freedom and Jeffersonian public happiness are in themselves — sufficiently explain the relations among the spheres nor, above all, why the state is the highest form. Indeed, by deflating the state into only one among several possible realizations of public freedom he makes acute the opacity of the state’s role in his theory. If this is so, then the puzzle about how a non-instrumentalist conception of the state as the true ground or substance of ethical life and the “ultimate end” (PR, § 260) of individual striving is to be conceived remains unsolved.
1 An earlier version of the present work appeared as Axel Honneth, Suffering from Indeterminacy: An Attempt at a Reactualization of Hegel’s Philosophy of Right, Two Lectures (Assen: Van Gorcum, 2000).
2 G. W. F. Hegel, Elements of the Philosophy of Right, translated by H. B. Nisbet (New York: Cambridge UP, 1991). The word “determined” is absent from the third sentence of this passage as quoted by Honneth.