The Peripheral Mind: Philosophy of Mind and the Peripheral Nervous System

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István Aranyosi, The Peripheral Mind: Philosophy of Mind and the Peripheral Nervous System, Oxford University Press, 2013, 232pp., $69.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199989607.

Reviewed by Andreas Elpidorou, University of Louisville


This book advances and defends the view that the mind is literally distributed in the body. That is to say, the mind is constituted not only by the brain and the spinal cord, but also by the peripheral nervous system (PNS). The experience of pain, for example, is not merely caused by activity in A-delta fibers and C fibers; it is constituted by such activity. The same holds, mutatis mutandis, for most conscious mental states.

The nine main chapters (the tenth concluding chapter is only two-and-a-half pages long) have varied and wide-ranging topics. Chapter 1 consists mainly of a series of first-personal reflections on the nature of embodiment during a period in which the author suffered severe peripheral neuropathy. Chapter 2 formulates the book's main thesis, the Peripheral Mind Hypothesis (PMH), which amounts to the claim that the PNS is a constitutive part of the mind (19). Chapters 3 and 4 articulate and defend the consequences of accepting the PMH. The former argues that the PMH defuses intuitions that drive epistemic arguments against physicalism. The latter argues against the possibility of a phenomenally conscious brain in a vat; it also offers responses to a number of objections to a functionalist account of the mind. Chapters 5 through 8 address the vexing issue of the mind's bounds and argue that the mind extends as far as the PNS of a healthy subject. Chapter 7 also offers an argument in support of the claim that the PNS is a constitutive part of the mind. Chapter 9 draws out some of the implications of István Aranyosi's position for the field of neuroethics.

If the book aims for originality and breadth, it succeeds admirably. Where it falls short is in persuasive force. Many key claims call for additional elucidation and support, and central arguments are underdeveloped and subject to objections that fail to get a fair hearing. The contention that the PNS is an important part of mentality deserves our attention, and Aranyosi should be praised for advancing a picture of the mind that is novel and that takes the involvement of the PNS seriously. Due to its philosophical importance, however, the presumed constitutive role of the PNS in mentality also deserves scrutiny and, indeed, a careful defense. It is a shame that Aranyosi does not offer that. I hope he will build on the project begun in this book.


Aranyosi formulates his main thesis as:

(PMH) Conscious mental states typically involved in sensory processes are partly constituted by subprocesses occurring at the level of the PNS. (22)

The qualification "typically" is crucial, and his discussion of PMH reveals that it does double work for Aranyosi. First, it restricts the scope of PMH to ordinary, everyday experiences. Second, it excludes from the scope of PMH certain types of ordinary experience that are not necessarily accompanied by activity in the PNS. Memory, reasoning, imagination, and dream experiences, for example, are deemed to lie outside the scope of PMH (21). In order to better understand Aranyosi's position, consider the following three cases.

Phosphenes. Phosphenes (the experience of seeing flashes of light) can be caused by mechanical, electrical, or magnetic stimulation of the retina or the visual cortex (Penfield and Boldrey 1937, Marg and Rudiak 1994, Kammer 1999, Antal et al. 2004). It is known that a retinal input is not necessary for the production of phosphenes and that even blind subjects can experience phosphenes (Brindley and Lewin 1968). Recently, it was demonstrated that transcranial alternating current stimulation (tACS) is capable of interacting with ongoing rhythmic activities in the visual cortex and inducing phosphenes (Kanai et al. 2008). Kanai et al. hypothesized that phosphenes are produced by direct stimulation of the visual cortex. If Kanai et al. are right, then it is plausible to hold that phosphenes are not constituted by activity in the PNS.

Aranyosi is aware of the difficulties that phosphenes pose for his account. He maintains that Kanai et al.'s interpretation is mistaken. He cites studies (Schutter and Hortensius 2010, Kar and Krekelberg 2012) that argue that the origin of the phosphenes is in fact retinal. Alternating current can travel and reach the orbital area and the retina (see also Schwiedrzik 2009). Consequently, phosphenes that come about from the application of tACS to the visual cortex could have been produced at the level of the retina and do not have to be the result of entrainment of cortical oscillations. Given that Aranyosi takes the retina and the optic nerve to be peripheral neural components, such an interpretation of Kanai et al.'s findings is in line with PMH.

Although suggestive, the works of Schutter and Hortensius and Kar and Krekelberg are not conclusive. They do not settle the debate regarding the origin of phosphenes. For more on this issue, see Paulus 2010, Kanai et al. 2010, Feurra et al. 2011, and Herrmann et al. 2013. The important point that needs to be highlighted is that the origin of phosphenes is an open empirical issue. Depending on how it is settled, it could provide (limited) support for Aranyosi's position. But empirical evidence does not only carry the potential to support PMH, it could also discredit it. In fact, other findings do not seem to be so kind to PMH.

Dreams. Dreams pose problems for the claim that the peripheral nervous system is a constitutive part of conscious experiences. It is thus unsurprising that Aranyosi excludes dream experiences from the scope of his account. Aranyosi, however, seems overly optimistic that such an exclusion alleviates the difficulties that dreams generate for PMH.

There are important phenomenological differences between dream experiences and waking experiences, but there are also notable similarities (Hobson 1988, Nir and Tononi 2010). Our dreams contain rich visual scenes that include colors, shapes, faces, and motion (Hobson 2009). Furthermore, dreams have both auditory and affective elements: they contain sounds and often speech, and during sleep, emotions such as pain, pleasure, and anxiety seem to be commonplace (Nir and Tononi 2010, Fosse et al., 2001). Even though the phenomenological similarities between dreams and waking experiences are reflected in some neurophysiological similarities (e.g., global brain metabolism is comparable between REM sleep and wakefulness; see Hobson et al. 2000, Maquet 2000, Nir and Tononi 2010), it has been observed that during REM sleep, activity in V1 is suppressed (Braun et al. 1998). Perhaps what is most telling is the finding that patients who have lost parts or all of V1 continue to dream visually (Rees et al. 2002). One can thus experience visual sensations during sleep even if there is little or no activity in the primary cortical areas (see Tong 2003 for a discussion of this issue). But if V1 can be dissociated from visual awareness during REM sleep, then so can activations of the peripheral nervous systems. (The dissociation of V1 from visual awareness also gains support from studies of visual hallucinations in schizophrenic patients. See, e.g., Ffytche et al. 1998).

As mentioned above, Aranyosi's strategy is to exclude dream experiences from the scope of PMH. But it is unclear what such a move accomplishes. If the same type of experience (e.g., seeing red, hearing a tone, or experiencing surprise) can be experienced both in dreams and in waking life, then why accept PMH? That is to say, why accept that the same type of experience is constituted both by the CNS (central nervous system) alone (in dreams) and by the CNS and the PNS taken together (in waking life) instead of simply maintaining that the CNS constitutes the experience in all instances and the PNS plays a causal role only in some instances? Unfortunately, this is a question that Aranyosi fails to address. Unless Aranyosi denies any type of phenomenal commonality between dreams (or hallucinations) and waking experiences, PMH would commit him to an overly complicated account of the metaphysics of sensations. Indeed, as Hill (2015) clearly and forcefully shows, Aranyosi is committed to a disjunctivist account for the metaphysics of certain types of experiences.

Pain in the absence of PNS activation. The most serious problem for PMH comes from the fact that there are instances of neuropathic pain that do not seem to involve activity in the PNS. Subjects who have suffered damage to their spinal cord or have had a stroke can experience pain without known peripheral activation. Even though such pain experiences can be affected by activity in the PNS, it is still thought that the pain is due to pathophysiological processes located in the brain and/or spinal cord (Boivie et al. 1989, Sidall and Loeser 2001, Yezierski 2002, Finnerup et al. 2003). Indeed, there are cases of spinal cord injury in which there is felt pain in the legs despite there being a complete transection of the spinal cord (Berger and Gerstenbrand 1981). I take such cases of pain as prima facie evidence in support of the claim that pain experiences are not constituted (even in part) by the PNS.[1]


A key claim by Aranyosi is that an acceptance of PMH carries important theoretical benefits. In chapter 3, he develops this point in detail. He argues that once we accept the view that the neural underpinnings of mental phenomena involve not only the brain, but also the spinal cord and the peripheral nerves, certain intuitions that make the problem of consciousness seemingly intractable disappear (44). Specifically, a revision of our folk-neuroscientific conception of the mind can disarm epistemic arguments against physicalism. Or so Aranyosi maintains. In what follows, my focus lies on Aranyosi's discussion of conceivability objections to physicalism. My main point, however, also applies to his discussion of Jackson's knowledge argument.

Consider the following three pairs of statements, all given by Aranyosi (46-47):

(1)  Actually, John is in pain.

(2)   It is conceivable that there be a physical duplicate of John, John*, who is not in pain.

(3)  Actually, John's nervous system is in a state S, and John is in pain.

(4)  It is conceivable that there be a physical duplicate of John's nervous system, S*, such that John's physical duplicate, John*, is not in pain.

(5)  Actually, nervous system S is in pain.

(6)  It is conceivable that there be a physical duplicate of S, S*, such that it is not in pain.

Aranyosi holds that the pair of statements (5) and (6) is importantly different than the other two pairs. Whereas (1)-(4) vindicate dualist intuitions, (5) and (6) do not. Specifically, Aranyosi holds that if we attribute phenomenal pain to the nervous system, then zombie nervous systems are inconceivable. Indeed, Aranyosi holds that (6) is "plainly false" (47). I am not going to adjudicate conceivability intuitions, so I will not discuss whether (6) is (or appears to be) true or false. Still, it is important to ask why Aranyosi thinks that physicalists should be committed to the view that the subject of phenomenal pain is the nervous system and not the person? Or to put it differently, why does the neuroscientific picture of pain that Aranyosi describes in this chapter (which consists mostly of a description of the gate control theory of pain) support such a view? We have learned a great deal from neuroscience and neurobiology regarding emotions, yet we are still reluctant to hold that it is the brain or the nervous system that feels shame. Is this a mistake? Are we confused? Or are we stubbornly resisting taking seriously the lessons of the empirical sciences of mind?

Aranyosi's argument in support of his position unfolds in three main steps. First, he maintains that even individual sensory fibers can be considered to be conscious. As Aranyosi clarifies, in the case of individual sensory fibers, "conscious" means "active or firing in a certain way" (50). Second, although there is a sense in which we can meaningfully state that individual sensory fibers are conscious, the notion of "what it is like to experience" is inapplicable at this level (51). There is nothing that it is like to be an individual sensory fiber. Finally, he concludes that since the notion of "what it is like to experience" is inapplicable at this basic level, it is inapplicable at any higher brain-based level. Aranyosi writes:

the notion of what it is like does not apply at this level [the level of an individual sensory fiber]. But if it does not apply at this level of the nervous system, then by what reason should it apply at higher, brain-based levels of it? If for the fiber to be "conscious" (in its own way) is, or even means, for it to have a manner of firing, then a "zombie fiber" is inconceivable. And then a zombie foot is inconceivable too; and so is a zombie nervous system. So, when we move to the neuroscientific discourse about consciousness, I argue, we should abandon this phenomenal way of thinking about consciousness. (52, emphasis in the original)

I have two reactions to this argument. First, the reason why it is inadequate to talk about "what it is like" at that basic level is precisely because it is not adequate to talk about consciousness at the level of individual sensory fibers. Consciousness understood as a personal-level concept or property (the type of consciousness that is operative in Nagel's "what it is like" locution) is not the same as consciousness understood as a subpersonal concept or property. Stated otherwise, and pace Aranyosi, talk of neuronal activity or firing is not talk of consciousness, unless one is an eliminativist about phenomenal consciousness. This brings me to my second point. Either Aranyosi is an eliminativist about phenomenal consciousness or not. If he is, then his position thwarts intuitions driving the conceivability objections, but it comes with a price that many will be unwilling to pay: it denies the very existence of phenomenal consciousness. If he is not an eliminativist, as Aranyosi's own discussion at places seems to suggest (see, e.g., 53, n.15 and 57, n.20), then the intuitions persist. Consider, for instance, what Aranyosi states when pressed with the issue of eliminativism:

The sense in which I use phrases like "Nervous system M comes to know P" is simply the sense in which one should have no trouble paraphrasing "John comes to know that P" as "This organism comes to know that P." (p.53 n.15)

But if this is so, then a mere paraphrase of (6), that is, re-writing (6) as either (4) or (2) would usher dualist intuitions back in. In fact, Aranyosi himself admits that (4) and (2) vindicate dualist intuitions. It seems then that we are back where we started.


Under one interpretation of the extended mind thesis -- one which holds that the physical machinery that enables a subject to possess mental states and run mental processes can include items that are located outside the subject's CNS -- Aranyosi's position would count as a version of the extended mind thesis. After all, if he is right, there is more to the mind than the CNS. Aranyosi, however, understands the extended mind thesis in slightly different terms. According to him, the extended mind thesis is true if the vehicles either of some mental states or of some mental processes can involve worldly elements as their mereological constituents. This is not a particularly idiosyncratic way of understanding the extended mind thesis; many proponents of the thesis describe it in the same way. Understood this way, however, the extended mind thesis is rejected by Aranyosi. His focus is Clark and Chalmers' (1998) articulation and defense of the extended mind thesis as this applies to cognitive states and processes. In chapter 6, Aranyosi argues that the extended mind thesis -- either as a claim about the vehicles of cognitive states (state externalism) or of cognitive processes (process externalism) -- is an untenable position. In this section of the review, I discuss Aranyosi's principal line of reasoning against process externalism.

In rejecting process externalism, Aranyosi accepts the guiding principle upon which much of Clark and Chalmers' original position rests, namely, the parity principle. Still, Aranyosi rejects that any of the examples that Clark and Chalmers offer are genuine cases of extended processes. They are not genuine cases of extended cognitive processes because they are importantly dissimilar from paradigmatic internal cognitive processes. And they are importantly dissimilar from such cognitive processes because they are mediated by the PNS.

The idea here is the following. Typical examples of internal cognitive processes are ones that take place within the CNS, whereas purported cases of extended cognitive processes are ones that involve the mediation of the PNS. Indeed, the environmental items that are claimed to be proper mereological parts of cognitive processes are items that are perceived and acted upon. But since the processes that take place within the CNS are not peripherally mediated (106), no external process could be thought to be isomorphic to an internally located one: the latter lack -- necessarily so -- a phenomenology that the former have. Owing to the fact that the two types of processes cannot be considered to be isomorphic, parity based arguments fail. Aranyosi summarizes his view:

This is why [Clark and Chalmers'] case for extended cognition is not convincing. Processes that couple the brain to some events outside the brain via the use of the PNS will inherit the "alienation" that the PNS brings about when it is used to mediate between those extra-cortical events and the central brain processes. We can think of the coupled system as a whole and even as a processing system, but we can't really take it as a central processing system, which is what it would take to consider such a system as a case of extended cognition. (107-08)

To be clear, Aranyosi's argument does not amount to the claim that all cognitive processes have to be central processes. To hold that all cognitive processes have to be central processes is to settle the issue of the bounds of the mind from the very beginning and via fiat. What is more, such an understanding of cognition opposes Aranyosi's own contention that there could be cases of cognition that do extend beyond the limits of the CNS. See, for example, his discussion of counting on one's fingers (120 and 152-55).

Aranyosi's argument is instead a variation of an objection to the extended mind thesis that was originally discussed in Clark and Chalmers (1998, 16). That is, Aranyosi holds that even though not all cognitive processes have to be centrally located, they still have to share an important characteristic with those which are internally located, namely, that they are not phenomenologically mediated via the PNS. Peripheral mediation somehow vitiates the cognitive status of the examples under question: it introduces a certain type of alienation between inner components of the cognitive agent and external items or structures. The introduction of such an alienation loosens, so to speak, the connections between the brain and the externally located, presumed cognitive items, so much so that the external items are no longer constitutive parts of the cognitive processes (108).

Much to my surprise, I could find no support for the crucial claim that peripheral mediation and importantly, the phenomenological alienation that it bestows, are sufficient to discount processes that include worldly structures as cognitive. What is so special about the phenomenology that the PNS is contributing that vitiates the purported cognitive status of extended processes? No clear answer is given.

Furthermore, Aranyosi only focuses on Clark and Chalmers' discussion of the extended mind and, consequently, on what have been called "first wave" arguments for the extended mind thesis (i.e., arguments that are based on versions of the parity principle or comparisons between external processes and paradigmatic internal cognitive processes) (Sutton 2010). A lot -- really, a lot -- has been written on the extended mind thesis since Clark and Chalmers' seminal essay. Even Clark has distanced himself from relying too much on the parity principle (2008, 114ff.).

In addition to first wave arguments, there are "second wave" arguments in support of the extended mind thesis. Such arguments stress complementarity and integration between external and internal structures and thus, if successful, would permit the vehicles of extended cognition to be different from those of inner cognition (Sutton 2010, Menary 2010). Baring a single footnote (120, n.9), a discussion of second wave arguments is absent. And even that footnote reveals, I believe, that Aranyosi does not want to engage seriously with second wave arguments. All in all, he simply does not say enough in this chapter in order to allow readers to judge the merits and demerits of his position. Indeed, if only one criticism of this book could be voiced, it would be precisely that: Aranyosi's treatment of important claims is simply too quick. This is true not only for the present chapter, but also for his discussion of the PMH in chapter 2. It is also true for his argument in support of the constitutive nature of the PNS that is advanced in chapter 7. After having read the relevant pages of chapter 7 a few times, the argument still remains elusive.


In addition to the themes mentioned above, the book contains insightful discussions of semantic externalism and neuroethics. And despite the reservations that I raised above, the book demonstrates rather clearly, I believe, that philosophers interested in the nature of the mind cannot ignore the PNS. Even if Aranyosi's discussion of the role of the PNS in mentality is not the final word on this topic, it is still a discussion worth considering.


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[1] I am grateful to Nanna Brix Finnerup, Jörgen Boivie, Philip Siddall, Robert Yezierski, and Howard Fields for helping me understand the involvement of the PNS in pain.