The Phenomenology of Moral Normativity

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William Hosmer Smith, The Phenomenology of Moral Normativity, Routledge, 2011, 232pp., $125.00, ISBN 9780415890687.

Reviewed by Robert Stern, University of Sheffield


At the outset of this engaging book, Smith suggests that it should be seen as a response to Elizabeth Anscombe's well-known claim that the distinctively moral sense of 'ought' should be 'jettisoned if this is psychologically possible', as the context in which it made sense, of God as moral law-giver, has now been lost.[1] One might wonder, however, what Anscombe would have made of this as an attempt to see off her concerns:

To put it in Heideggerian terms, the face-to-face instantiates my understanding of my being, it instantiates my understanding of meaning as meaning or my attunement to norms as norms, to normativity as such. I am a being that is responsive to norms -- I act in light of norms -- because I have been claimed by the face. The face baptizes me in the name of the normative; I respond to the face when I hear the baptismal name as my own for the first time. I confront the existential question of the meaning of my own being -- the question of what I should be -- because I have been enjoined by the face and have responded to this injunction. (p. 184)

To see how Smith gets to this point, and to assess whether it is a satisfactory reply to Anscombe, more needs to be said about the approach he chooses to adopt in this book, and why.

The clue here is in the title: Smith thinks that in dealing with the problem of the moral 'ought', we need to draw on the resources not only of contemporary analytic philosophers -- figures such as Christine Korsgaard and Stephen Darwall -- but also on the work of more 'continental' thinkers, such as Edmund Husserl, Emmanuel Levinas and Martin Heidegger. The more phenomenological approach of the latter tradition, he believes, will augment the approach of the former, and so help us in resolving the issues raised. For, Smith suggests, while analytic philosophers 'have accurately described what it is like to hold oneself accountable to certain moral values and how one ought to weigh and exchange moral reasons with others' (and so have contributed to the phenomenology of the normative in what he calls a 'narrow sense'), 'they haven't yet fully articulated the experiences that make this moral deliberation possible and to which it is beholden' (p. xiii).

It turns out, however, that Smith wants to do more than introduce these continental thinkers into the debate in a general way; rather, each is given a specific place in the structure of the book, which proceeds in a dialectical manner. That is, different positions are discussed which turn out to be limited or one-sided, such that they then lead on to a seemingly opposite approach, but where in the end it turns out that a combination of these different views is required. Thus, at the highest level, Smith plays off what he calls the 'first-personal' outlooks of Korsgaard and John Drummond's Husserlian meta-ethics, against the 'second-personal' outlooks of Darwall and Levinas, where he uses Heidegger to arrive at some sort of synthesis of the two. The book therefore has a neat (perhaps suspiciously neat) structure.

Smith introduces his contrast between first-personal and second-personal views at the beginning of the book, where both are contrasted with a third-personal approach. The basic taxonomy will be familiar to readers of Darwall's recent work.[2] Thus, the first-personal view holds that moral obligations arise from the results of individuals’ practical deliberations as agents, whereby these individual cannot think about how to act without constraining themselves in some moral manner. The second-personal view, by contrast, takes these constraints to come from the authority that others have over the individual, in expressing a moral demand. Finally, a third-personal view sees the individuals as bound by certain features of the ethical situation itself, where this exerts an authority over them that is neither first- nor second-personal.

Smith is quick to dismiss the last option, associating it with realism and raising for it Korsgaard's familiar complaint that any such position can only satisfy our theoretical reason but not our practical reason: 'The difficulty that confronts the third-personal approach is how to translate a theoretical truth into the practical arena: how do facts get a normative grip on the agent's will?' (p. 9). Whether this move will suffice to dismiss the third-personal approach; whether that approach is realist in any objectionable sense; and whether the other views also involve significant elements of realism, are all of course contentious matters, which as Smith admits are not given full treatment here. But let us follow him in moving on to the two options that are his main interest.

The first of these is the first-personal approach, whose 'analytic' representative is Korsgaard, and whose 'phenomenological' representative is Drummond. On the positive side, Smith sees value in this stance, as he accepts that self-constraint must play a role in explaining moral normativity, which (he thinks) is what the third-personal view ignores. On the other hand, he worries that this position may descend into moral solipsism, as the individual gets too great a say over what is to count as a moral obligation for her. Thus, when it comes to Korsgaard, Smith tries to illustrate this problem by emphasizing the difficulties in her attempt to move from the valuing of one's own humanity to valuing that of others via a Wittgensteinian argument from the publicity of reasons – something that has often been said to be a significant sticking point in Korgsaard's project. And when it comes to Drummond, Smith argues that the fundamental solipsism of Husserl's phenomenological approach in the end vitiates Drummond's attempts to offer a more inter-subjective outlook.

In order to escape these difficulties, Smith then turns to a more second-personal position, where Darwall and Levinas are his central exemplars. The threat of solipsism is resolved in so far as we are no longer working just from the first-person standpoint of the reflective subject, while we also avoid the difficulties of the third-personal approach. However, despite this apparent advance, Smith argues that there are also drawbacks to the second-personal option. The problem for Darwall, he suggests, is that 'the presumptive authority of the individual who adopts the second-person standpoint, and the authority of the moral community to issue moral claims from this perspective, are never justified . . . [so] we are not told what makes the authority of these moral obligations legitimate, or how legitimate and illegitimate assumptions of authority are to be distinguished' (p. 81). In the end, Smith argues, the only way for Darwall to explain how others get authority over me is if I take this to be rationally acceptable; but this, he claims, pushes Darwall's position back into a first-personal perspective, and the problems this entails. At this point, Smith turns to Levinas as presenting a possible way out for Darwall, in so far as Levinas offers a close phenomenological treatment of what it is like to experience the authority of the other in a second-personal way. However, no matter how perceptive this treatment is, Smith still takes it to be unsatisfactory, as in the end it just describes the way in which that authority is experienced by us, without vindicating it. To do this, Smith argues we must go back to something valuable in the first-personal stance and combine the two approaches.

This Smith attempts to do by turning to Heidegger. The details are complex, but the upshot is that Heidegger's conception of the subject can be used (perhaps against his own intentions) to show that while the moral demand comes from the other in a second-personal way, this very demand is required in order for the individual to be a subject at all, and so can be given a first-personal vindication. In the end, then, Smith offers us a position which he takes to contain both first-personal and second-personal elements, in a way that is both coherent and to the mutual advantage of each side. The result, Smith argues, is what he calls a 'two-part account of moral normativity':

According to our phenomenological account, the two-part grounding of moral normativity runs this way: the normative force of particular moral obligations is given by my reflective endorsement, a first-person commitment to the norms of my moral community . . . ; this first-personal moment of self-responsibility or authentic moral agency is [also] invested by and responsive to the second-personal moral authority of others -- their dignity as persons, the normative ground of morality itself -- which is their independent standing to hold me accountable and to call for my aid. (p. 170)

This two-part approach, Smith thinks, will provide the right dialectical balance, and the solution we need to Anscombe's challenge to the moral ought.

What are we to make of all this? There are certainly some features of Smith's book that make it attractive. Thus, it is surely worthwhile to explore the common ground between 'analytic' and 'continental' philosophers on these issues -- where, for example, the juxtaposition of Darwall and Levinas can help shed light on both (but where the Danish philosopher Knud Ejler Løgstrup would also have been an interesting point of comparison, particularly concerning his notion of the radical ethical demand).[3] Smith is also good at giving the reader a focused but largely accurate view of the thinkers he discusses, and he puts these views into a clear argumentative framework. He also has some useful critical points to make. But despite these merits, I think there are also significant difficulties in Smith's approach, and the final position he offers us.

This can be brought out if one returns to Smith's starting point, with Anscombe, and the way in which he conceives of the problem of moral obligation in the first place. Like many, Smith sees this problem as arising from the problem of moral scepticism posed by the egoist: 'Why should we act ethically? Why should we avoid doing moral wrong? Why should we, for example, not kill another person if it were useful or beneficial [to us]?' (p. 4). This then becomes the central test of the theories under discussion: can they address this sceptical challenge satisfactorily? But taken in this way, the results of Smith's investigations are perhaps predictable: on the one hand, the sceptic is given reasons to be moral, but which seem to rest rather too much on first-personal perspective and interests, while on the other hand, the sceptic is given second-personal reasons whose authority she can challenge, as too remote from her concerns. This, of course, is precisely the oscillation that H. A. Prichard warned against when he argued that moral philosophy rests on a mistake -- namely, the mistake of trying to engage with the egoist at all.[4]

Moreover, far from resolving this tension, Smith's dialectical resolution seems merely to reproduce it. Smith, of course, hopes to have the best of both worlds when he writes:

Ontologically speaking, we have moral identity not because of our desire to value our own humanity, but because we are called to ethical responsibility by others and we are always in the position of having responded to this claim before we have taken on a practical identity or adopted a public persona. We have a deep reason to be moral because we have always already acknowledged the face [of the other] before we are subjects; it is our transcendental condition and we must acknowledge it in the authentic disclosure of our being-with others. This is the starting point for our response to the challenge of moral skepticism and ethical egoism. (pp. 164-5)

Thus, Smith argues, in so far as I find myself confronted by the demands of the other, the 'ought' is not self-imposed, but nonetheless the vindication for this 'ought' comes from its role as a transcendental condition for my own self-hood, where this is where my 'deep reason' to be moral is said to lie, in a first-personal manner. But it seems to me that Prichardian worries then arise immediately.  In so far as the justification for the moral ought is taken to come from its nature as a transcendental requirement for being a self at all, doesn't this put any such justification in the wrong place? Shouldn't this come from the moral plight of the other person, as Levinas and others would insist? But if that is right, we seem to be back with just the kind of purely second-personal approach which Smith thinks (surely rightly) that no egoist is likely to accept. In the end, then, I do not see how Smith's solution (if I understand it correctly) can address the problem it has set itself.

At this juncture, I think, going back to Smith's original starting point with Anscombe is helpful. For, it seems to me entirely wrong to see Anscombe as raising anything like this egoistical challenge to ethics or morality.[5] Rather, her challenge was more ontological or metaphysical: having once had a metaphysical framework in which talk of moral obligation made sense, we have now lost that framework, so ethics needs to be re-thought -- where the 'harm' she is concerned about is not the harm that concerns the egoist (where do my interests get served here?), but the 'harm' of continuing with a system that has lost its underlying coherence (where one such harm will be, she thinks, the kind of consequentialism that she deplores in other parts of the article).

Now, suppose this had been Smith's starting point: can we make sense of moral obligations once we have abandoned divine command ethics? Here 'make sense of' does notmean (for example) 'justify to the egoist why they should not kill someone when it is in their interest to do so', but rather show what could replace God as the source of something resembling a moral law. Taken from this perspective, as Anscombe herself suggests, the question is whether such a law can come from ourselves in an act of self-legislation, or from the moral community of which we are part, or from the world itself  Each of these options may also be glossed respectively as 'first', 'second' or 'third' personal, but not in quite the way Smith does; and the test for such approaches is not whether they can answer the moral sceptic but whether they can capture the law-like features that the idea of moral obligation seems to require.

Now, I see no reason why the figures that Smith discusses could not be interpreted as addressing precisely this sort of question. But if they are, Smith has set up the wrong test for the adequacy of their views, and so the dialectical pressures that supposedly lead to his 'two-step' position no longer apply. Instead, just to take one example, we need to ask whether Anscombe might accept Levinas's phenomenological appeal to the face of the other as an adequate alternative to a divine command view, or rather just see it as the phenomenological remainder of a practice that makes no sense without it, a ghostly echo of a moral perspective that has otherwise been lost to us.  Here the elusive references to God in Levinas's phenomenological account may serve to reinforce Anscombe's insistence that in the end this provides the inescapable context to the normativity of morality after all. In addressing the issues as he does, therefore, it may be said that Smith distorts the way in which a truly fruitful encounter between the 'analytic' and 'continental' traditions might go, with the result that in the end he arrives at an answer that Anscombe would find to be less than properly satisfying -- or so it seems to me.

[1] See G. E. M. Anscombe, 'Modern Moral Philosophy', Philosophy 33 (1958), pp. 1-19.

[2] See, in particular, Stephen Darwall, 2006. The Second-Person Standpoint. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.

[3] See The Ethical Demand, translated by Theodore I. Jensen and Gary Puckering, revised by Hans Fink and Alasdair MacIntyre (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1997). Darwall has commented on Løgstrup in an NDPR review, while the connections between Løgstrup and Levinas have been explored by several commentators.

[4] See 'Does Moral Philosophy Rest on a Mistake?', Mind 21 (1912), pp. 21-37.

[5] As well as mentioning Anscombe, at the start of his book Smith also refers to Nietzsche as another morality critic he wants to assuage, while also elsewhere mentioning Levinas's well-known comment at the start of Totality and Infinity that 'it is of the highest importance to know whether we are not duped by morality'. However, although I cannot go into detail here, I would equally claim that the concerns raised by Nietzsche and Levinas over morality are misrepresented if thought of in egoistical terms.