The Philosopher's Touch: Sartre, Nietzsche and Barthes at the Piano

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François Noudelmann, The Philosopher's Touch: Sartre, Nietzsche and Barthes at the Piano, Brian J. Reilly (tr.), Columbia University Press, 2012, 166pp., $26.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780231153942.

Reviewed by Daniel Herwitz, University of Michigan


Three philosophers at the piano, each possessed by music, playing often (and with varying degrees of excellence). Three philosophers whose choice of music and style of playing deepen our sense of them as human beings. They play to think and to get away from their lives as thinkers, to become swaying, tensile bodies pressing fingers onto keyboard, sight-reading scores (mostly romantic, Chopin, Schumann, Ravel), pouring themselves into the expressive intensities of musical gesture and sound. What they seek is absorption in a medium which synergizes their thought and personality with its rhythm and measure. They want to exit the world of the thinker while also retaining its broad strokes.

Although the writer of this gem of a book (full of beautifully written incident, readable during a short plane flight) does not pursue it, the picture of art found in it accords with the writing of Roland Barthes, one of the book's protagonists. Barthes always stressed that the intense, haunting, mesmeric, seductive character of a medium derives from its doubleness. In The Grain of the Voice, the voice is understood by Barthes as a conduit for meaning (of the libretto, the theme, the expressive orders of human melodrama) and a uniquely untranslatable individuality with its peculiar, haunting, overwhelming "grain". This solicitation and refusal of meaning, this representational character and absolutely peculiar, hair-raising effect of the voice is, when fused into one thing, what convulses the imagination.

 In photography doubleness comes from the way certain kinds of photos capture the past while also seeming to levitate the past from its pastness, allowing scenes and people from forgotten lore to as it were hover before our eyes, as if prestidigitated to life. The madness of the photo consists in its ability to allow the viewer to feel that the dead have come to life again, hovering spectrally in the present, while also confirming their absolute absence from us, since they are in fact nothing beyond recordings from the past imprinted on photographic paper.

With music doubleness is a matter of music's meaning and structure on the one hand (its logical order if you will) and its absolute refusal of, or transcendence from, ordinary and certainly linguistic meaning in the name of gesture and sound. Roquentin, Jean-Paul Sartre's alienated protagonist in Nausea, wishes to grasp the recording in his hand as if to make it stop, to cease the flow of the music and turn it into a palpably conceptualized fact, a part of the spatial furniture of the world, and this because music outruns his conceptualization: deep down there is nothing to conceive about it apart from its rhythmic dynamics and tonal flow. Music is the metaphor of a world whose river of activity defeats the ability of the conceptualizing mind to grasp it (read: possess it in one's hand, make it stop). It is a living icon of skepticism. The hand of the piano player is one driven to the keyboard and immersed in its polyphony, not one that stills the flow. And so music carries thoughts, and the thinking mind is brought to it, but its flow and timbre are absolutely peculiar.

The word "peculiar" is not Barthes's but Wittgenstein's, the Wittgenstein of the Philosophical Investigations who writes about two senses of the peculiar: transitive and intransitive. When one is asked what is peculiar about a person's hair there is often a clear answer: he has dyed it bright green and it is pointy on top, crew cut on the sides. Here the word peculiar is being used, Wittgenstein says, transitively: the kind of peculiarity can be given an answer. When one asks by contrast what is peculiar about the smell of coffee (Wittgenstein's famous example), knowledge by acquaintance is what is wanted, and only then will the highly profiled languages of coffee (this one smells and tastes like burnished leaves with a slight berry flavor and a touch of bitterness) find their sense. There is no respect in which the peculiarity can be explained in other terms than those which thus take their sense through the experience. And Sartre, Nietzsche and Barthes at the piano are there to press themselves into the joys of this kind of peculiarity: which engagement with the piano uniquely affords. Each thinks at the piano but plays to escape from thinking.

Noudelmann's book is an essay in which three philosophers at the piano are beautifully and aptly characterized. He wishes to provide no general account of their analytic and speculative writings by looking to the piano. However, Noudelmann stakes the book on the thought that to know a thinker is to know something beyond what that thinker wrote, and to know about the thinker personally. The source of this is Michel de Montaigne, who held that to know a thinkers' writings is also to know something of their selves, their bodies, habits, temperaments. Noudelmann's book is a work of imagination which leaves readers in a high pitched state of imagination about thinkers one may know well. They feel they know Sartre better by knowing how Sartre played, what he played, something of what the playing meant to him. The piano provides a fresh perspective on well-studied intellectuals, no easy task.

Sartre, Nietzsche and Barthes were all dedicated amateur pianists who played regularly and with devotion. Nietzsche was a composer as well. He wrote over seventy compositions (some incomplete) in the hope of making a mark in the history of music similar to his mark in philosophy. (He was disappointed in this regard, however, since he had limited talent for composing.) For Nietzsche music and philosophy were far more closely intertwined than for Sartre and Barthes: Nietzsche's choice of Wagner as candidate for the superman bespoke his belief that music would inaugurate the future, set modernity on its proper footing, contribute to the revaluation of values he so desired. "Music became not only a privileged object for philosophy but also an ideal -- an issue of aesthetic and metaphysical import, a touchstone for all human activities and human values." (p. 50) "Through the piano, Nietzsche used music the way Montaigne, one of his favorite thinkers, had taken up ancient authors: Once digested by our bodies, their ideas belong to us. Nietzsche let the world in through his ears to the point of indigestion" (p. 93). His piano playing signaled a philosophical style which was meant to better, and replace, current styles of thinking (those which kept modernity in a state of violent, aggressive disempowerment). The world, Nietzsche believed, was too often thought an object of sight rather than a living emporium of sound, smell, and touch. Hence his obsession with smelling out the truth, hearing the world's reverberation through the past, touching something as a way of understanding it. This privileges music (especially the touch of the finger on the piano).

Noudelmann's book contains a superb recounting of Nietzsche's break with Wagner and his music which, Nietzsche came to believe, assimilates transcendence to the sublime and re-sacralizes modernity with music as its icon. Wagner is a drug. Nietzsche especially disliked Wagner's adulation of Heimat, that German place which is also a place of identity and communalism, oozing mythic origin, destiny and the rootedness of culture in the small, anti-cosmopolitan (if not xenophobic) forest and town. Chopin was Nietzsche's personal pianistic love, associated with the warmth and emotion of the Mediterranean south, that central corrective to German Protestantism and northern rectitude which Nietzsche craved personally and believed essential to the values of civilization. Nietzsche's critique of Wagner is, Noudelmann tells us, of import now:

Today such a critique [as Nietzsche's] remains of great value because it exhausts the deadlocked, obsessional oppositions between conservatism and modernity. It dismisses both the illusions of the sacred (its false depths; the intoxication of the sublime) and the clear conscience of the profane (positivism; self-satisfied hedonism). It renders obsolete both traditionalism (reverence for the ancients; deference to past authority) and presentism (naïve devotion to the new; the transgressive gestures of the avant-gardists, formerly futurists, which have since become merely a sales pitch for the continued replacement of consumer goods). (pp. 79-80)

Sartre, who learned to love piano growing up in the home of the Schweitzers, and associated it with his mother, was stiff at the keyboard. Although his public writings and talks were addressed to serious/severe avant-garde twentieth-century music, his heart remained in the nineteenth century where he went to flee the difficulty of politics and public life. And so Sartre the dedicated public intellectual relaxes in the privacy of his adopted daughter's apartment reading through the scores of Schumann, in retreat from public life, politics, returned to his world of Schweitzer childhood, surrounded by books and music: "Disrupting the world through transvaluation or revolution also requires a pause, an arrhythmia, a unique tempo that was, for Sartre, his piano playing." (p. 47)

Music plays an obsessive role in his early writing, especially Nausea, where we see Roquentin try to literally grasp the music from the phonograph and freeze it into a conceptually philosophical object. Music is the object of obsessional control (always failed) but also of liberation. For the essence of existential nausea in that book derives from the inability of an alienated intellectual to simultaneously experience life (live it) and control/write/conceptualize it at the same time. This desire to be-here-now while also once removed as detached philosophical writer of life leads to the collapse of pleasure. The desire bespeaks an inability to immerse the self in the world, to go with its flow; it is compensated by an endless listening to the "negress" singing "Some of These Days". This book hits you over the head with its sense of transcending existential nausea through the power of her Orientalized voice, her full bodied improvisatory riff. The jazzwoman sings without alienation, from the gut, and in doing so defines a style of life Roquentin cannot himself achieve. Music is thus a philosophical model, a guide for the perplexed. Ironically it turns out that Sartre had invented everything about this song, which was not composed by a Jew in New York (as Roquentin thinks) but composed by a black person and sung by a white woman. The sax Roquentin praises is in fact a clarinet! So much for stereotypes.

Barthes brought a lyricism and sense of syncopation to his beloved Schumann and Ravel. He found in their music a counterpoint between melodic softness, rhapsodic burst and rhythmic thrust which he identified (that is, felt in his bones) as erotic. With Barthes the erotics of the piano are highlighted, its percussive touch and engagement of the entire upper body (not to mention legs and feet). Barthes: the limpid syncopation, disruption of structure in Ravel, the adoration of Schumann, the mother; a style unfamiliar to his own, strict writing, and yet appropriate to its diaphanous, fascinated range and sense of reveling in detail (from photography to fashion). In a masterpiece of psychoanalytically interesting overstatement Noudelmann announces: Barthes's "Piano playing comes close to onanism" (p. 138), or what Woody Allen elsewhere called sex with someone you really love (your own keyboard). Well, perhaps.

None of these philosophers are interested in music as language, as logical form, or as a model of metaphysical structure. Music plays the role of philosophical model (of how to live); it is the substance of an encounter with modernity. But at the piano, the philosopher transcends philosophy, seeking a disappearing act, a private act.

Noudelmann's book is musically sophisticated and informed by deep knowledge of the piano. No book like it has been written, nor one -- for this is among its virtues -- which becomes in the end an essay on the aesthetics of the piano. One could say Noudelmann out-Brillat-Savarin's that philosopher of the kitchen by turning from kitchen to parlor and giving the baby grand its due. This little book is a unique chapter in the aesthetics of the piano, and serves as a wonderful opening beat for a suite of others to follow.