The Philosophical Sense of Transcendence: Levinas and Plato on Loving Beyond Being

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Sarah Allen, The Philosophical Sense of Transcendence: Levinas and Plato on Loving Beyond Being, Duquesne University Press, 2009, 378pp., $26.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780820704227.

Reviewed by Deborah Achtenberg, University of Nevada, Reno


In The Philosophical Sense of Transcendence: Levinas and Plato on Loving Beyond Being, Sarah Allen discusses Levinas's philosophical transcendence in tandem with Plato's, compares the two philosophers' use of erotic love as the source of transcendence (for Levinas, in his earlier works), and explores and compares the treatment of religion's relation to philosophy in each philosopher's account of transcendence. Utilizing an interesting and fruitful notion of upward and downward transcendence, she shows that Levinas and Plato are similar in conceiving erotic love as a source both of satisfaction and of transcendence, comparing and contrasting the two philosophers on a variety of topics as she goes along, including divinity, creation, order, desire, fecundity, the good beyond being and many more.

Allen's interpretation of Levinas is a God-centered one. For Levinas, she maintains, transcendence comes to us from God and enters into philosophy (5). Levinas's God is a "source of order that gives direction and place to the various voices that constitute philosophical thinking" (315) and, as such, is to be both compared and contrasted with the good for Plato: the good, similarly to God, is a source of order, but the good is different from God since the good is not personal and not a creator. Not only is God a source of order that gives direction and place to philosophical voices, even more, according to Allen, religion is the experience and revelation of God (208), and (especially in the later works) once we achieve transcendence, "the self no longer speaks in its own voice, but in the voice of God" (315). God's role in ethics is not quite as strong for Allen as these points would indicate, however. Invoking the idea of the "posteriority of the anterior," she goes on to argue that, for Levinas, God reveals himself to me indirectly through ethical relations with others. A personal, singular, creator God is at the origin of Levinas's metaphysics of creation according to Allen, but the God Levinas has in mind is a nonmystical, Judaic God, not a Platonic form like the good. His God is one who, after or in the act of creation, withdraws from creation leaving only a trace of himself, a trace to be found in ethical relations. As a result, God and creatures remain separate and Levinas's philosophy is not onto-theology.

Some of what Allen argues here about God and religion is straightforward Levinas interpretation; for example, the idea of creation followed by withdrawal or separation, the idea that it is in ethical relations that God comes to mind and the idea that Levinas's God is approached through ethics and can appeal to reason rather than being a God revealed in mystical experience. Her account of creation and withdrawal is particularly well-developed, useful and interesting due to an important stress on the relationship between the il y a stage and the withdrawal after creation. Moreover, her interpretations of Levinas on religion are marshalled to support an interesting approach to a Levinas-Plato comparison, one that specifically emphasizes how for each of them our approach to others is connected to our relationship to what is highest.

Other points, though, are more speculative and, given that the role of God in Levinas's philosophy is a contested one, require more defense or elaboration. How is God a source of order if we cannot cognize him, for example? Why not see God as a source of Levinasian rupture? Why assume religion is the experience and revelation of God rather than, simply, a non-totalizing bond with any other as suggested in Totality and Infinity: "We propose to call 'religion' the bond that is established between the same and the other without constituting a totality" (40)? Are experience and revelation the experience and revelation of God or, instead, do 'experience' and 'revelation' specifically connote our relation to otherness as such in contrast to terms such as 'disclosure'? When Levinas utilizes an idea of creation -- he calls it a "rigorous idea of creation" (292) -- is he speaking of God's creation or of creation in a more extended philosophical sense as any relation that both relates and withdraws at once in its relating to an other? Along with these points, some of Allen's interpretive framework requires elaboration, such as the idea that Levinas relies on a Judaic conception of God. What Judaic conception? That of Maimonides? Of Luria? Of Rosenzweig? This, too, is contested and in need of development since Allen makes Levinas's particular approach to religion central to her contrast of him with Plato on eros and philosophical transcendence.

On the topic of the relation between erotic love and transcendence, one of Allen's main goals is to show that Levinas and Plato are not as different as they seem by introducing the helpful idea of upward and downward transcendence in Plato: upward from the sensible to the eternal including the good and downward back to the lower, for example in the case of the one who, in the Republic, ascends out of the cave to see the good and then goes back down and governs others. Allen's point is that this upward and downward movement is comparable to Levinas's idea of the non-sensual component of erotic love that goes beyond erotic sensuality and transcends by accomplishing desire in fecundity. She adds support to this important interpretation by pointing out that according to Diotima in the Symposium, love starts out as desire to possess the good but then is transformed into the desire to give birth to the beautiful.

Other ideas Allen includes in her account of the relation of erotic love and transcendence seem less useful or clear and in need of more development through detailed interpretation of the Platonic texts adduced. For example, central to her account is the idea that the good as well as the resourceful part of eros are plentiful and giving, begetting through their nature as bountiful. (Eros is a combination of need and resource according to Diotima in the Symposium -- metaphorically speaking, the son of Need, who is female, and Resource, who is male.) The flavor of these claims is neoplatonic or Christian but Allen responds to such an objection by making it clear that she is not adducing Christian agape. Still, there is no evident connection by itself from the claim in the Republic that the good is the source and nourishment of all being to the specific idea of overflow or bounty (she adduces the claim to support the idea), nor is the fact that Resource, in a drunken unconscious stupor, is made by Need to have sex with her enough to characterize the fecundity that results from the forced, unconscious sex as fecundity that results from Resource's giving nature.

Surely the resonances of the Platonic text are different than that and have something to do instead with the relation between the madness and force involved in eros and its resulting fecundity. Moreover, in the image it is Need that is resourceful, suggesting that Need and Resource are somehow one, or at least intertwined, thus provoking the reader to ask what the resourceful need alluded to is and how it is related to philosophy, especially since eros is described by Diotima as a philosopher. It seems more likely that the Platonic point is in fact to describe eros as resourceful need -- need that as such pushes us to be resourceful -- and as similar to awareness of ignorance that, as such, moves us to inquire. This is more likely the point rather than to describe eros as one part need and one part overflowing bounty.

Similarly, it is too quick to say that because for Plato the good is part of his metaphysics, ethics is "first philosophy in Plato" as it is in Levinas (51). The fact that the good is a form or idea for Plato does not mean that "metaphysics and ethics coincide" (51) for him. It means that metaphysics and value coincide. The good is real for Plato, but if ethics coincides with anything for him, arguably it is with epistemology at least to the extent that he believes "virtue is knowledge." I, at any rate, count myself among those who believe that virtue is knowledge for him even in the Republic, since the tripartite view of the soul is corrected by the accounts of the soul that come after it. For Socrates in the Republic and elsewhere, I would argue, once we know the good, we love it and therefore do it. If this is so, then the priority of metaphysics and epistemology to ethics remains for Plato and is a point of distinction between Levinas and Plato. But, even if I am wrong that Plato retains the view that virtue is knowledge, the good's inclusion in metaphysics does not by itself mean that ethics is first philosophy for Plato. That inclusion implies instead that metaphysics is prior to ethics for Plato since the good is a metaphysical principle that those who are ethical must know and follow. Put differently, it implies that the good is a source of order on which we base our philosophy and our actions, to bring us back to one of Allen's own points and her own terminology discussed above.

Allen's book is an ambitious and challenging one, outlining a strong overall interpretation of Levinas on erotic love, religion and transcendence. It contains numerous helpful and illuminating interpretations of Levinas's texts and of the relation of Levinas's ideas on the book's topics to Plato's. The book also has some weaknesses, including, as indicated above, hints of a neoplatonic path not taken and as a result not well-described, as well as a need for more detailed support of claims about the centrality of religion and God to Levinas's account and about the interpretation of the details and resonances of specific Platonic dialogues. Overall, The Philosophical Sense of Transcendence is an important contribution to the ongoing discussion of how Levinas's work relates to Plato's.