The Philosophy of Adam Smith: Essays Commemorating the 250th Anniversary of The Theory of Moral Sentiments

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Vivienne Brown and Samuel Fleischacker (eds.), The Philosophy of Adam Smith: Essays Commemorating the 250th Anniversary of The Theory of Moral Sentiments, Routledge, 2010, 266pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415562560.

Reviewed by Eugene Heath, State University of New York at New Paltz


This collection offers a valuable set of essays to commemorate the 250th anniversary of the first edition of Adam Smith's Theory of Moral Sentiments (TMS). Originating at a conference held at Balliol College, Oxford, in January 2009, the thirteen essays are framed by the editors' introduction and, at the close, a brief recounting of Smith's six years at Balliol. Many of the contributors -- including the editors -- are among those whose careful scholarship has illuminated our understanding of Smith's thought.[1] Some essays offer comparative analyses (Smith and Rousseau, Hegel, or Joseph Butler), others examine the vagaries of Smith's idea of sympathy, or assess his account of honor, resentment, natural belief, or value. In their introduction, the editors point out that a philosopher's legacy includes being treated "as a philosopher" (10). Many of the essays succeed quite well in this regard, though some might have shined more brightly with further editorial burnishing. Nonetheless, the book, which also serves as a special issue of the Adam Smith Review, offers insights, challenges, and some novel considerations.

The first section, devoted to moral phenomenology, begins with a brief essay, "The Virtue of TMS 1759," by D. D. Raphael. Noting how the first edition proved appealing for the vividness of its language and its innovative notion of sympathy, Raphael draws our attention to David Hume's less than fulsome assessment, as well as to Edmund Burke's letter to Smith in which Burke relates how he was "'pleased'" and "'convinced'" (20) by Smith's theory. Raphael does a service in quoting from Burke, who also writes, "'there is so much elegant Painting of the manners and passions, that it [TMS] is highly valuable even on that account'" (20). Burke articulated what many of us still appreciate: that the philosopher and economist from Kirkcaldy was a profoundly acute observer of humanity, a genuine moral phenomenologist.

Two other essays round out this opening section. In "The Theory of Moral Sentiments and the Inner Life," Emma Rothschild offers a suggestive exploration of how the TMS is an historical work. As Smith develops the book over six editions, he employs historical examples to illustrate his insights. His theory reveals how history, in circumstance and social interaction, is relevant to practical moral judgment. To those with theoretical interests in moral and cultural development, the TMS resonates still. In the third paper, "The Standpoint of Morality in Adam Smith and Hegel," Angelica Nuzzo seeks to argue that there are important affinities between Hegel's account of civil society and Smith's conception of morality. For example, Smith's idea that self-understanding arrives via a comprehension of how others see us resembles Hegel's thesis that we know ourselves through our social interactions. This instance of similarity, along with others, leads Nuzzo to conclude, somewhat quickly, that "when Hegel says that morality has its proper place in civil society, the morality he seems to have in mind is Smith's" (47).

The major section of the book devoted to "Sympathy and Moral Judgment" contains six essays, the first of which is a stimulating paper by Charles L. Griswold, "Smith and Rousseau in Dialogue: Sympathy, Pitié, Spectatorship and Narrative." Drawing from Smith's review of Rousseau's Second Discourse, Griswold suggests that Smith held that Rousseau, like Bernard Mandeville, maintained that we are not naturally sociable. Indeed, Smith seemed to believe that Rousseau's notion of pitié cannot overcome this incapacity. Griswold describes how Smith employs a visual model of spectatorship that Rousseau himself might dispute: Smith writes of the imaginative conception of another's situation as if it were a matter of seeing facts when in fact it is a "process of getting 'inside' the agent and his situation" (68). As Griswold suggests, Rousseau could point out how such an imaginative process requires ascertaining context, as well as comprehending how events extend to the past or the future. In Smith's review of the Second Discourse he also characterizes Rousseau as employing mere "'rhetoric and description'" (72). Yet, as Griswold discerns, the real conflict between Smith and Rousseau is that Rousseau recognizes how the self is not transparent, not available to visual inspection, but must be understood narratively.

In "Adam Smith's Concept of Sympathy and its Contemporary Interpretations," Bence Nanay challenges recent claims that Smith's understanding of sympathy is a forerunner of contemporary conceptualizations such as simulation and empathy, each of which presupposes a similarity or correspondence of mental states between spectator and agent. Nanay asserts that Smith's understanding of sympathy does not presuppose or entail such correspondence. He proceeds to consider what is involved in Smith's process of imagination -- "being in someone else's situation" (85). Nanay seems to regard the essential notion of Smithian sympathy to be this sort of imaginative process. However, in the TMS the fundamental concept of sympathy is as a correspondence of sentiment between agent and spectator, a harmony that, if recognized, generates moral approval. Smith occasionally refers to the imaginative act -- which may (or may not) generate correspondence -- as "sympathy," but this imaginative process is more properly distinguished as "imaginative sympathy."[2] Nonetheless, the lesson that Nanay draws is that "sympathy" (as imaginative process) typically involves taking up features of another person's psychology, but sometimes not. This conclusion is sound, for the imaginative process that Smith seeks to illuminate is, as Nanay concludes quite carefully, one that manifests "heterogeneity" (93). What we must reject, Nanay urges, is the idea that sympathy (as imaginative process) entails any mental correspondence between the sympathizer and the person with whom one sympathizes. But there was no reason to accept this in any case.

Two essays take up the related topics of respect and resentment. In "Smith's Ambivalence about Honour," Stephen Darwall revisits his examinations of two kinds of respect, that of honor and that of second person (or equal dignity),[3] noting their differing implications for social order and authority. In Smith's TMS, he contends, we have a nascent idea of second-person respect, but we also encounter an ambivalence about status and hierarchy. Naturally ambitious, we confuse the recognition and sympathy of others with the idea that we are worthy of esteem. Although ambition has this corrupting element, it also reinforces rank and status. A similar ambivalence emerges in Smith's account of rank: not to defend one's status constitutes moral failure, even as Smith displays his own ambivalence about the emotion (resentment) that would motivate such defense. In her essay "Resentment and Moral Judgment in Smith and Butler," Alice MacLachlan describes perceptively how Smith's conception of resentment shifts, in the TMS, from that of a disagreeable and unsocial emotion to an emotion with which others may sympathize. This second conception includes the "wish that the perpetrator come to feel towards the original injury in just the same way that we do" (166). Joseph Butler also takes up the topic of resentment, noting two kinds, one that is angry and one that is moralized and deliberate. As MacLachlan explains, however, Smith's two notions of resentment are distinct from those of Butler. Not only does Smith provide a more complete depiction, but he also explains how resentment develops from non-moral to moral emotion, so that it "moralizes itself on its own terms" (172).

Geoffrey Sayre-McCord, in his "Sentiments and Spectators: Adam Smith's Theory of Moral Judgment," describes how Smith's standard of the impartial spectator may be affected by various "irregularities" (132), including the influence of fortune and custom. Smith himself does not think that these irregularities constitute any sort of defect, so Smith must have some kind of standard by which to judge them. There is little reason to think that Smith embraced any overarching utilitarianism that would justify the irregular influences, so Sayre-McCord suggests something else. Smith does not appeal to an independent standard to determine what is proper or improper for the impartial spectator; rather, he uses this standard itself! More generally, Smith forwards a distinctive account of moral judgment according to which such judgments assume the justifiability of their own standards; any consideration of the justifiability of these standards requires a consideration of the standards themselves. Sayre-McCord's resolution, refreshing and subtle, coheres nicely with a plausible reading of the TMS: Smith seeks to explain our moral judgments (the standards that we share), and in so doing Smith explores the point of view of the impartial spectator. This spectator furnishes a standard whose justification, allowing for beneficial irregularities, will be assessed in terms of the impartial spectator. If there exists an element of circularity here, the deeper point is that there is no alternative: we must not suppose "there are a priori or otherwise independently available principles we might use" (139).

In "Smith's Anti-Cosmopolitanism," Fonna Forman-Barzilai draws from her recent book,[4] thoughtful and morally serious, to revisit the question of Smith's localism. She contends that the impartial spectator is a cultural creation and may, thereby, reflect biases and parochialism. Forman-Barzilai interprets the interactions of sympathetic agents as tending to "progressively constrain the agent's understanding of herself, of others, and of the world" (150). Although one need not accede to this pessimistic consideration of sympathetic interaction, neither does Forman-Barzilai surrender to an assessment of Smith as hopelessly parochial. She points out that part of the value of Smith's thought is that he allows space for transcending the local, whether in the form of his theory of commerce among the nations or in his dispersed thoughts that indicate a universalist conception of justice.

The third section of the book contains essays on several themes. In "Adam Smith's Problems: Individuality and the Paradox of Sympathy," Robert Urquhart contends that within the TMS tensions exist between the personal and the impersonal, between moral sentiment and the impersonality of general rules and the impartial spectator. The individual is pulled towards society via general rules and by an impartial spectator who demands the sort of "complete impartiality" that undermines "the foundation of morality in sympathy and spectatorship" (187). The tensions that Urquhart claims for the TMS could be set forth more meticulously and starkly. Urquhart claims that the isolation of the individual is more pronounced in the Wealth of Nations, a work whose "self-contained" economy is not sufficiently related to Smith's moral theory. One must turn to Hegel, "one of Smith's most careful readers" (191), to find "what Smith is lacking" (192). However, it is not so plain that Smith's theory of the market is divorced from his ethics. Urquhart maintains that Smith should have "placed his economics explicitly in the framework of his ethics" (192) but that the placement is not explicit does not mean that it is not there at all.

In "Scepticism and Naturalism in Adam Smith," Ryan Patrick Hanley broaches the question of Adam Smith's religious skepticism. In an intriguing essay, which takes up topics not otherwise broached in his recent and fine book on Smith,[5] Hanley contends that Smith embraces Hume's idea of "natural belief " (a universal belief attained without reason, such as belief in an external world, or in the reliability of the senses) and employs it as the basis for asserting his own claims to natural beliefs in the existence of a deity and in divine justice. Hanley draws his evidence from three salient passages, including the paragraph (TMS II.i.5.10) in which Smith asserts that the "present inquiry" concerns a "matter of fact," not a "matter of right." Hanley suggests that Smith's real purpose in this passage is to apply Hume's doctrine to belief in a deity, a belief born of a desire to see the unjust punished. In this instance, Hanley rightly points out some similarities to Hume's doctrine, though these need not entail that Smith "has Hume's theory in mind here" (202). A second passage (II.ii.3.12), from the sixth edition of TMS, and taken to be "Smith's reconsideration . . . of revealed religion" (24) is interpreted more persuasively. Here Hanley suggests that "the ineradicable persistence of our most fundamental natural belief" (206) provides the best defense against Hume's "sensible knave." A third passage, "the very suspicion of a fatherless world" (VI.ii.3.2), also suggests natural beliefs in a deity and divine justice. Although these beliefs arise as much from hope or fear as from the nature of things, the evidence adduced is suggestive. Hanley's work illuminates our understanding of important passages and provides a new avenue for assessing Smith's understanding of theistic belief.

In "Adam Smith's Solution to the Paradox of Tragedy," Arby Ted Siraki contributes an interesting essay that addresses a current topic without sacrificing historical interest. The question that interests Siraki is why a spectator might feel pleasure upon viewing unpleasant or tragic scenes. Siraki canvases the responses of Thomas Hobbes, Joseph Addison, Hume, and Burke. Smith's solution, asserts Siraki, is sympathy: whether in real life or dramatic representations, pleasure arises as spectator and actor come to share the same feelings. The appeal to sympathy, as Siraki notes, will also provide a means of critical judgment. Siraki's points are well-taken, though one should hesitate at his suggestion that sympathy cannot be "automatic" or that it is "only possible through an act of the imagination" (223). In fact, Smith seems to allow for an immediate sympathy (e.g., I.i.4.9; I.i.1.3; III.3.23). Siraki also suggests that "for sympathy to occur, approbation or admiration must be present" (224), but this seems to put the moral cart before the sympathetic horse! These quibbles aside, this is a strong essay that helps to reinvigorate interest in Smith's aesthetics.

In his essay, "Smithian Intrinsic Value," Patrick R. Frierson reveals how Smith's theory of moral judgment frames three senses of intrinsic value: non-instrumental, non-relational and trumping value. In a well-focused essay, Frierson points out how Smith's notion of value is a "proper-attitude" theory in which "things have value just in case they are objects of proper valuing attitudes" (232), specifically, the attitudes "with which impartial spectators can sympathize" (235). Smith's particularism poses a challenge to an understanding of non-relational value, but Frierson articulates a plausible distinction between the situation-dependence of valuing attitudes versus attitudes of situation-dependent value. Trumping values would seem to be "situation-independent" (243), but these, Frierson argues, can be dealt with through Smith's appeal to general rules: a general rule trumps particular judgment. This interpretation is less convincing than Frierson's other analyses. Formed from experience, Smith's general rules may express any values, so it remains unclear how some general rules function as trumps. Indeed, Smith characterizes general rules less as a means of overriding other values than as a protection against, say, the misrepresentations of self-love.

A final entry is Ian Simpson Ross's engaging account of the years Smith spent at Oxford as a "Snell Exhibitioner." In "Adam Smith's Smile: His Years at Balliol College, 1740-46, in Retrospect," we encounter comparisons of Balliol and Glasgow University, a summary of Smith's independent study (including his reading of Hume's Treatise of Human Nature), along with a closing look at Balliol's changing attitude towards "one of the greatest sons of the House" (261).

This is, on balance, a strong collection. Scholars of Adam Smith and eighteenth-century moral philosophy should welcome it and profit from it.


[1] Taking into account only the books of the contributors, we have Vivienne Brown, Adam Smith's Discourse: Canonicity, Commerce and Conscience (London: Routledge, 1994); Ian Simpson Ross, The Life of Adam Smith (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1995); Charles L. Griswold, Adam Smith and the Virtues of Enlightenment (New York: Cambridge University Press, 1999); Emma Rothschild, Economic Sentiments: Adam Smith, Condorcet, and the Enlightenment(Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2001); Samuel Fleischacker, On Adam Smith's Wealth of Nations: A Philosophical Companion (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2004); D. D. Raphael, The Impartial Spectator: Adam Smith's Moral Philosophy (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007); Ryan Patrick Hanley,Adam Smith and the Character of Virtue (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2009); and Fonna Forman-Barzilai, Adam Smith and the Circles of Sympathy: Cosmopolitanism and Moral Theory (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2010).

[2] Tom Campbell distinguished sympathy as correspondence of sentiments from the process ("imaginative sympathy") that may (or may not) bring that correspondence about. Adam Smith's Science of Morals (London: George Allen & Unwin, 1971), 96.

[3] As in his outstanding, The Second-Person Standpoint: Morality, Respect, and Accountability (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2006), or "Two Kinds of Recognition Respect for Persons," in Eguale Rispetto, I. Carter, ed. (Milan: Mondadori, 2008).

[4] Adam Smith and the Circles of Sympathy.

[5] Adam Smith and the Character of Virtue.