The Philosophy of Autobiography

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Christopher Cowley (ed.), The Philosophy of Autobiography, University of Chicago Press, 2015, 242pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780226267920.

Reviewed by James R. Hamilton, Kansas State University


Christopher Cowley's edited collection makes good on its promise to begin to fill a lacuna in the literature of philosophical aesthetics. Cowley correctly notes in his introduction that this gap exists because the literature of philosophical aesthetics has for the most part simply ignored, as issues about autobiography, philosophical issues that are of particular relevance to this widespread genre of writing. Part of the reason for that, in turn, is that many philosophers, in aesthetics and other fields, have already been hard at work on problems that are of philosophical interest in their own right, even though they also relate to many issues about autobiography.

Some of those problems are: the nature of narrative; whether a narrative mode of understanding exists, how a person's conception of herself is expressed and whether that expression must be narrative in form, the relation between memory and agency, the ubiquity of self-deception, the distortions enacted upon oppressed people and the various ways that can result in (or lead to resistance of) distorted decision-making, and whether there is genuine moral luck. The list is actually quite large.

And it occasions the thought that at least one thing distinctive about the genre of autobiography is that it engages each of these issues -- and more -- in a most palpable way: one simply cannot evaluate an autobiography without, implicitly or explicitly, taking a stance on most of these very issues; and it appears one cannot even so much as read or watch an autobiographical work without evaluating it. Cowley has been sensitive to this fact and has included essays that deal directly with many, perhaps most, of the issues that give rise to this distinctive feature of autobiography.

For example, a number of the papers address aspects of this pair of questions: (a) how does a person's conception of herself find expression? and (b) can that expression be narrative in form? Peter Lamarque, Galen Strawson, Dan Zahavi, and others have argued for a negative answer to the second of these questions. The lines of attack are clear: narratives have narrators, but unless we, hubristically, think of our lives as narrated by God or, equally problematically, think of our lives as narrated by ourselves, making us the "authors" of our own lives, our lives do not have narrators; characters generally satisfy genre expectations, but no one's life does that exactly; narratives have beginnings, middles, and ends, but our lives do not; everything that happens in a narrative is represented as happening for some reason, but it is simply not true that many events in our lives can be represented in this fashion; and so on.

The task undertaken by some of these authors is to avoid those problematic implications while still holding that it is at least profitable -- for certain purposes and under specific conditions -- to see our lives as narratable or to draw important parallels between understanding a character and understanding ourselves. Others in this collection are still more cautious. But I believe that all these essays rest on some version of the thesis and are forced, ultimately -- if not explicitly -- to deal with the first question in the pair as well.


That said, it should also be noted that none of these essays accepts outright, at least without serious qualification, the conception of the self-as-narrated. Rather those which do explicitly express a commitment on that issue, for example the ones with which the collection begins, hold the much weaker claims either that the self is narratable (Marya Schechtman and Christopher Hamilton) or that we can with profit examine our uses of language in the same way we must examine the uses of language of literary characters (Garry L. Hagberg). As is to be expected, the issue of self-deception looms large in this section. But it does so in some unexpected ways. For example, arguing for an enlargement of the notion of meaning (from word meaning to something else, which I am inclined to call "thematic" meaning), Hagberg (61ff) presents a novel twist on the question of accuracy in autobiography: since an autobiographer's own memory of events may only give "imperfect recollections," it is untenable to call everything false or distorted in an autobiography a "lie."

The next group of papers discusses the relationships among storytelling, knowledge, self-knowledge, and agency. Once again, the exposure of autobiographical writing to self-deception is central to the issues discussed in this section. In the first of the group, Marina Oshana expresses the boldest endorsement of the narrative-self in the collection, I believe. But even she comes to it indirectly, by way of examining what it takes to be a "self-governing agent." She concludes that something like a narrated self is required for agency. To make her case, Oshana distinguishes among persons, selves, and agents, holding that the elements of selfhood that are germane to agency are "those that make self-recognition possible" (105ff), those that turn out to be the ones on which the self-as-narrated can get a handle. This theme, however, is made more complex by John Christman's essay, in which he argues that such self-recognition depends upon shared public understandings of a kind that are equally dependent upon sharing of cultures. But when one considers the self-recognition available to oppressed peoples (his examples are African-American slaves and Native-Americans) this sharing of cultures between author and reader becomes fraught if not outright impossible. Somogy Varga, whose essay concludes this section, begins with a now-standard notion of self-deception in which someone both believes and does not believe the same proposition. He explicitly rehearses current thinking on the notion of self-deception. This is a salutary and, by this point in the collection, a long-overdue contribution. Varga then argues that, on the most popular models of autobiography, such self-deception is not actually possible. He then argues in favor of a third model in which self-deception, whatever analysis we give to that notion, is possible.

Next is a pair of essays raising issues about the traditional analyses of autobiographies and the sources of moral obligations entailed by or within autobiographical story-telling. D. K. Levy asks just what it is that is being evaluated in moral evaluations of autobiographies. And he suggests it is what he calls "the autobiographical act," namely, "a presentation of the autobiographical content in a medium, with a motive, conveying a moral judgment" about that content, the life of the author (159, italics in original, and 169). In contrast to the standard view of this matter, Levy holds that it is not, or should not be, the content (alone?) that is morally evaluated, but rather the autobiographical act itself. Merete Mazzarella does not directly dispute Levy's contention, but does note that in crafting an autobiography, one is also crafting stories about the lives and purposes of others, making them parts of one's own projects. If one gets her autobiography published, moreover, she has made their projects her own in a very public way. There is plenty of room here for moral evaluation; and Mazzarella not only notes it, she both illustrates and engages the moral dimension with respect to the autobiographical elements in the biography she wrote of her own mother.

The final pair of papers, by J. Lenore Wright and Áine Mahon, explore autobiographies of two philosophers who, along with notable others (including Rousseau, also referenced by many authors in this collection), have written not only philosophical essays but also autobiographies. The two philosophers discussed are Simone de Beauvoir and Stanley Cavell. Wright claims that Beauvoir makes two moves in her writing that make her autobiographical writing both distinctive and distinctively philosophical. The first is to describe herself in universal terms ("woman") and as a very particular instance ("I") of that universal. The second is to show how the description of her particularity and that of her particular experiences creates a model for women -- especially women philosophers -- as "agents of their own identities" (195) and "creates a new mode of philosophizing about the self" (213).

Stanley Cavell's philosophizing exhibits his well-known tendency to insert both self-awareness and self-criticism into the discussion of philosophical issues. For some, this has been cause for cult-like adoration of his work and, for others, the source of discomfort with and disappointment in it. Cavell has long taken the stance, as Mahon observes, of acknowledging this fact about his style but deferring any real defense of it. This changed with the publication of his second autobiography, Little Did I Know (2010), in which, Mahon claims, Cavell began actually to defend the claims made for his "idiosyncratic picture" of life and the role of philosophy in it. She explores these claims by returning to what she calls "three particularly persistent anxieties" that are expressed in that autobiography: fear of fraudulence, fear of obscurity, and fear of exposure (218). In their own ways, Wright and Mahon explore the truth in Nietzsche's famous remark that every work of philosophy is "a species of involuntary and unconscious autobiography;" yet each takes up philosophers for whom the writing of philosophy and autobiography were both voluntary and conscious, even self-conscious.


At the outset, I noted that part of the reason for the neglect of autobiography in philosophy and philosophical aesthetics in particular is that many philosophers have already been hard at work on issues that are philosophically interesting in their own right, even though they also relate to issues about autobiography. We might also add that in not taking the genre of autobiography seriously, philosophers have failed to notice two things: (a) that insights gained from thinking about those issues can be enriched by reflection on how they might play out in autobiographical writing and reading, and (b) the genre of autobiography engages with issues about our own lives in ways that most other genres of literature do not, and that fact is, in itself, worth exploring. I believe this collection goes a long way to addressing those issues as well as filling the aforementioned gap in philosophical aesthetics.

All that said, it was something of a disappointment to see so little empirical material from cognitive psychology cited, let alone discussed. In my view, philosophers have a good deal to learn from contemporary cognitive psychology (and vice versa, to be sure) about the possession of a self-concept, the role of narration in its formation and sustenance, the depth and particular shape of self-deception, other forms in which memories may be falsified, and so on. Quite a few of the issues and claims made by some of these philosophers writing on them are, broadly speaking, empirical issues or claims. No doubt, there is something to be said for staking the claims and shaping the debate. Indeed that is a role that philosophers are particularly good at fulfilling, especially for our empirically-minded colleagues in psychology. But wherever empirical claims are made, to me it seems appropriate -- indeed, just so much commonsense -- either to put them to empirical test or to acknowledge the fact they are empirical and to suggest the shape such testing should take.