The Philosophy of Biology: An Episodic History

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Grene, Marjorie and David Depew, The Philosophy of Biology: An Episodic History, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 438pp, $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521643805.

Reviewed by David Hull, Northwestern University


Marjorie Grene and David Depew have combined forces to produce an episodic history of the philosophy of biology from Aristotle to the present. As the title of this book implies, they are writing a history of the philosophy of biology, not a history of biology. Even so, in writing a history of the philosophy of biology, they cannot very well ignore biology. Grene and Depew begin dealing with life itself. Evolution, as it should, comes in only much later.

The first four chapters of their book concern the views of a half dozen of the most important scholars ranging from Aristotle and the Aristotelians to William Harvey, Descartes and Newton. These chapters range over two thousand year--from the fourth century BC to the 17th century. As might be expected these discussions are abbreviated but hardly superficial. Grene and Depew have to deal not only with the writings of these men but also the highly technical secondary literature that has grown up around them. I am afraid that most readers, excluding professional philosophers, will find the chapters on Aristotle and the Aristotelians formidable, but they are worth studying. No one is better able to explain Aristotle and his "biology" than is Marjorie Grene. Her introductory text on Aristotle remains in print to this day.

One of the purposes of these early chapters is to show that the contrast between physics and biology has been around from the beginning of Western thought. Grene and Depew note that the "subject matter of biology has something about it that is not quite the same as physics" (p. xv). One of the challenges that Grene and Depew face is that two of the major figures whom they treat--Descartes and Newton--were far more concerned with physics than with biology. Aristotle and Harvey were certainly "biologists." Descartes and Newton were not.

However, Grene and Depew do mine the literature on these two men as much as possible to discover what they had to say on what we today term "biology." After all, Descartes was famous for treating organisms as machines. According to Descartes, all organisms, save human beings, are nothing but machines. In addition each of us has a mind. For Grene and Depew, Descartes' bête-machine is their bête noire. But Descartes dealt with several issues that are closer to biology, including a dispute with Harvey about the circulation of the blood. As central to both physics and the philosophy of science as Newton certainly was, Grene and Depew treat him in only a cursory fashion because he did not contribute to biology, nor did biology influence his philosophy of science all that much. He did, however, have an impact on the philosophy of science.

Grene and Depew have an easier time of it when they turn to the 18th century. Linnaeus, Buffon, Lamarck, Geoffroy St.-Hilaire and Cuvier were biologists, primarily systematists, natural historians and comparative anatomists. This was the pinnacle of French science, Linnaeus notwithstanding. Grene and Depew detail the rivalries, first between Linnaeus and Buffon and then between Geoffroy St.-Hilaire and Cuvier. Lamarck seemed to find himself in opposition to just about everyone. In these battles, Linnaeus and Cuvier won. We are lucky that so much really excellent work has been done on these biologists. The secondary literature is both extensive and comprehensible. For example, even though Linnaeus was considered a creationist by both his contemporaries and subsequent scholars, it turns out that in his later works he introduced a theory of transmutation.

Grene and Depew devote an entire chapter to Kant even though they admit that he did not discuss biology all that extensively. His views were simply too influential in Germany to ignore. To my surprise Kant turns out to have a lot more to say about living creatures than I had thought. The most fundamental philosophical issues were teleology and natural purpose, but Kant also found himself embroiled in the monogenism-polygenism dispute. Did the various races of human beings belong in one species or several?

Kant opposed polygenism and supported his position by reference to Buffon's species concept. The contrast is between species as eternal forms defined in terms of essential characteristics (perhaps clusters) or as historical entities maintained by successive breeding (p. 80). Are species kinds (Arten), lineages (Gattungen) or both (p. 118)? Life would be easier if these two species concepts always divided up the living world in the same way, but they don't. Because miscegenation was far from unknown at the time, Kant concluded that all human beings belong to a single species. In the following century, a temporal dimension was added to this dispute. One species might split into two or more species, and a single species might have its origin in two or more species.

As always Darwin provides the watershed for biology. Geology was the chief impetus. In addition, British scientists took it on themselves to develop philosophy of science as a professional discipline, just in time to be confronted by a theory that seriously challenged their philosophies. John Herschel and William Whewell were the founding fathers of philosophy of science in Great Britain, and in the case of Whewell at least biology played a role. For some reason, Grene and Depew do not discuss John Stuart Mill at any length, possibly because he came along later. What is disturbing is that all three of these men-- the very men who devoted a good part of their professional lives studying science as science--rejected Darwin's theory. Species do not evolve, and if they do, they certainly do not do so by means of natural selection--the law of higgledy piggledy.

After the chapter on Darwin, Grene and Depew proceed along a familiar path beginning with the "non-rediscovery" of Mendel's laws at the turn of the century. In the early years scientists tended to refer to the "discovery" of Mendel's laws, but historians were put off. Mendel discovered these laws. At the turn of the century, they were "rediscovered." Then later as historians dug more deeply into the literature, they decided that their predecessors had seriously misunderstood Mendel, reading present-day concerns into his work. Mendel was no Mendelian. Hence, the early "rediscovers" of Mendel's laws were actually "non-rediscoverers."

Grene and Depew move along familiar ground as they discuss the work of such biologists as Hugo de Vries, Francis Galton, William Bateson, Karl Pearson and W. F. R. Weldon. From there they proceed to the rise of the Modern Synthesis attributed to R. A. Fisher, J. B. S. Haldane, Sewall Wright and to a lesser degree Julian Huxley. The next stage in this "synthesis" was produced by Theodosius Dobzhansky, Ernst Mayr, G. G. Simpson and G. Ledyard Stebbins. In the second half of this chapter, Grene and Depew give the critics of the Modern Synthesis their say Ð starting with Richard Goldschmidt, but then moving quickly to more recent developments, in particular the works of Wynne Edwards, G. C. Williams, W. D. Hamilton, Dick Lewontin, Steve Gould, Niles Eldredge, E. O. Wilson, Richard Dawkins, and David Sloan Wilson. Some of these biologists viewed themselves as opposing traditional versions of evolutionary theory while others thought of themselves as improving upon them. I personally see little rhyme or reason to which alternative a particular biologist adopted.

In the penultimate chapter Grene and Depew turn to the contributions made to these controversies by philosophers of biology. Of course, distinguishing between philosophers, scientists and philosophers of science as I have in this review begs for a deconstructionist diatribe. Was Aristotle a philosopher? How about a biologist? Of course these terms were not coined in English until much later. After all Aristotle spoke ancient Greek, not present-day English. But did Aristotle engage in activities similar to those that at least tax some present-day biologists? The answer is yes. If Aristotle is not a biologist, then neither are these present-day scientists.

The contrast between philosophers and scientists is even harder to draw. For example, most people today think of Descartes as a philosopher and Newton as a scientist because of the very different fates that their work received, but in their day Descartes and Newton were engaged in much the same array of activities. Present-day philosophy of biology and biology merge seamlessly. Both philosophers and biologists contribute to this endeavor. In this penultimate chapter of their book, Grene and Depew evaluate the contributions made by biologists and philosophers of biology to such issues as the species problem, reducibility, function and teleology--issues that have been debated in some form or other from Aristotle to the present.

In the final chapter, Grene and Depew address a grab bag of topics that are not all that related to the book as a whole--the descent of man, polygenism and monogenism once again, the nature/nurture controversy, brains, language, mind and the human genome project. Because of my own interests, I might be excused for treating one issue in my own work that Grene and Depew discuss--the metaphysical status of species as the things that evolve. A fairly standard distinction in philosophy from at least Plato and Aristotle to the present is between classes and individuals. The terms change, but the distinction remains fairly constant. Classes are groups or sets of entities. All the planets in the universe form a class. A subset of these classes is important because they function in laws of nature -- at least for those philosophers who think that such things as laws of nature exist. Even though the universe is finite, laws of nature are commonly characterized as being spatiotemporally unrestricted. Hence, the classes that function in them must also be spatiotemporally unrestricted.

Individuals are quite another kettle of fish. They are spatiotemporally restricted. They come into existence and pass away. For example, Mars is an individual planet. Just as ordinary language includes the names of numerous classes that are of no interest to scientists, ordinary people identify all sorts of different individuals, most of which are also of no interest to scientists. The universe is full of individuals, but a subset of these individuals is especially important because laws of nature range over them. According to most philosophers throughout the history of philosophy, natural individuals and natural kinds are quite different things. At the very east, one is spatiotemporally restricted, while the other is spatiotemporally unrestricted.

In the 1970s Michael Ghiselin and I thought that we had stumbled upon something new. Even though biological species had been commonly treated as paradigm classes throughout the history of Western thought, they have almost none of the attributes that characterize classes and nearly all of the attributes that characterize individuals--that is, if species evolve the way that most evolutionary biologists think that they do. In a sense, Ghiselin and I were not suggesting anything all that radical. We were not introducing any drastic changes in the traditional distinction between classes and individuals. We were merely urging that we move species from one metaphysical category to another--from class to individual.

Admitting that we had gotten one of our examples wrong does not seem to be such a momentous affair, but numerous philosophers and some biologists were disturbed. Grene was especially irate. In order to avoid treating species as individuals, she is willing to modify the traditional distinction between classes and individuals. Why not countenance classes that are temporally restricted? If all the planets in the universe form a class, why not all the terrestrial planets? The answer is that the former is a candidate to function in laws of nature, while the latter is not. Grene also admits that on her suggested interpretation, individual organisms now become classes. Just as species are made up of classes of organisms, individual organisms are made up of classes of cells (p. 300). Fido is a class! We might even discover the law of Fido.

Why go to such lengths just to retain a commonsense notion of species as classes, possibly natural kinds? One answer is that lots of people, including Grene, want to be able to look into their garden and see a robin redbreast. They are not about to engage in all the empirical research necessary to discover the place of this robin in its genealogical nexus. I agree that finding out what one needs to know in order to determine what is or is not an evolutionary species is not easy. Still, I think that evolutionary biologists, if they are to understand the evolutionary process, must do just that.

Grene also thinks that I reject appeals to "properties, which are typological, and so wicked" (p. 301). To the contrary, properties play a central role in my view of the evolutionary process. Where we differ is that on my view genealogy is primary while properties are secondary. Secondary may not have the pride of place as primary, but it is not nothing. In addition, I have nothing against typology as long as it is properly applied. Treating particular species typologically is a mistake, but there are many things in the biological world that warrant being treated typologically, the species category itself perhaps. How wicked these views may be, I cannot say.

A second reason why so many people are so conservative with respect to species is that we human beings form a species. If something is true of all species, then it is true of our species, and lots of people do not want to visualize the human species as part of a genealogical network. According to the class interpretation, a certain list of characters defines Homo sapiens. Anyone who lacks one or more of these characters is either not a human being or not a normal human being. On the part-whole interpretation, a newborn baby born without plantigrade feet is still a human being. If your parents are human beings, then you are a human being. If you mate successfully with another human being, then you too are a human being. Homo sapiens, like all sexual species, is part of a particular genealogical nexus. That may not sound right, but there it is. Although Buffon did not think that species evolve in the modern sense of this term, he did view species as genealogical units. Since Ghiselin and I first published, we have discovered a long list of scholars who thought that species are better treated as individuals than as classes.