The Philosophy of Claude Lefort: Interpreting the Political

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Bernard Flynn, The Philosophy of Claude Lefort: Interpreting the Political, Northwestern University Press, 2005, 394pp, $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 0810121069.

Reviewed by Fred Dallmayr, University of Notre Dame


For English-speaking students of political philosophy, this is an eminently welcome book. Claude Lefort is one of the most innovative and insightful philosophers and political thinkers of the last half century -- but a thinker largely ignored or sidelined in America. Bernard Flynn is highly qualified to remedy this deficit. A long-term friend of the French thinker, he has attentively followed the evolution of Lefort's thought, devoting to it a series of probing articles. Flynn's own scholarly focus has been on Continental thought and especially on phenomenology after Husserl -- a focus prominently displayed in his earlier study Political Philosophy at the Closure of Metaphysics. In the Introduction to his new book, Flynn presents the French philosopher as preeminently concerned with the ambivalent character of modernity -- and also with the difficult linkage between theory and practice. "From its very beginning," he notes (p. xiii), Lefort's work "has set for itself the task of interpreting the political life of modern society" and especially the task of discerning the political "form" or distinctive "regime" of modern democracy. In contrast to devotees of "pure" theory or abstract metaphysics, Lefort has allowed his theorizing to be informed by his own lived condition (or his embeddedness in the "life-world"). In fact, Flynn adds (pp. xviii-xix), Lefort's political philosophy is "born from a reflection on political experience and a consideration of the forms of political life." In particular, his thinking about modern democracy is not a rehearsal of abstract ideas but rather an attempt to evoke "an experience of democracy," more specifically "a lived experience of the dissolution of the [metaphysical] markers of certainty that characterized the ancien regime."

In Flynn's view, Lefort's practical-experiential mode of theorizing distinguishes him from a number of thinkers by whom he was for a long time overshadowed -- including Sartre's radical subjectivism, Derrida's "worldless textualism," Levinasian transcendentalism, and Habermasian rationalism. To be sure, his own distinctive perspective emerged only slowly through trial and error. As a young man during the Second World War, Lefort joined one of the French currents of Trotskyism. After the war, together with Cornelius Castoriadis, he founded a group called "Socialisme ou Barbarie" which championed a non-repressive socialist politics against the barbarism of the immediate past. The most decisive influence on Lefort's outlook, however, came from two of his teachers: Maurice Merleau-Ponty and Raymond Aron. The former's post-metaphysical phenomenology pointed him in the direction of "intertwining" -- beyond the binaries of rationalism and empiricism, foundationalism and relativism. The influence of Aron bequeathed to Lefort the commitment to a non-dogmatic or non-ideological liberalism -- and also a strong aversion to any kind of coercive and "totalitarian" rule. Largely under the impact of these converging influences, Lefort was inspired to develop his modern/postmodern phenomenology of democracy where the latter is seen as both a distinct political experience and a novel political "regime" on a par with the regimes of classical philosophy. Following the same trajectory, he was also led to discern the novelty and hideous quality of modern "totalitarianism" as a political paradigm distinct from traditional tyranny. In Flynn's words (xxi): "Arguably Lefort is one of the few political philosophers -- together with Hannah Arendt, Raymond Aron and a small number of others -- who have elaborated a plausible interpretation of the totalitarian phenomenon" by pinpointing some of its non-traditional features.

The Introduction clearly indicates the correlation between the conceptions of democracy and totalitarianism in Lefort's thought. In the latter's view, modern democracy was ushered in by a series of political revolutions which overturned the basic premises of traditional society, especially the idea of the king or ruler as the visible embodiment of the "body politics." In the premodern ancien regime, Flynn comments (pp. xxiv-xxvi), "the king's body played the role of mediator between the sensible and the supersensible, that is, the point of intersection between the visible and the invisible"; to this extent, the king "incarnated society's identity." Against this background, modernity for Lefort signals "the disincarnation of society," that is, the emergence of a condition where no figure can embody society's unity and thereby symbolically link it with a "supersensible world." What is important to notice here is that disincarnation leaves a trace: although the "figure of the king" may be effaced, the "place" which he occupied remains -- as an "empty place." Interpreting this change with the help of Merleau-Ponty, Flynn observes that the "empty place" in modern democracy "testifies to society's nonclosure on itself, which is to say, its nonidentity with itself"; differently stated, it "blocks society's 'immanence' in a manner similar to Merleau-Ponty's notion of the body's immanence with itself which is always 'short-circuited' at the last moment." What modern totalitarianism introduces, by contrast, is a reversal of this openness or nonidentity. Basically, for Lefort, totalitarianism is "a response to the modern experience of the void" -- a response that seeks "to fill the empty place of power." Viewed in this light, the totalitarian project (in both its Fascist and Stalinist garb) constitutes "a counterrevolution against democracy": more specifically an attempt to fill the empty place "with a materialization of 'the people' -- a people no longer in conflict with itself but rather a People-as-One."

Somewhat surprisingly, the book opens with three chapters devoted to a detailed reading of the writings of Machiavelli as seen from Lefort's perspective. As it happens, the work of Machiavelli looms large in several of Lefort's early writings, especially Le travail de l'oeuvre: Machiavel (1972). What attracted Lefort to this work was clearly not its reputed "Machiavellianism" but rather its sensitivity to political divergence. In many ways, the Florentine appeared to him as a herald or precursor of typically "modern" developments: particularly the "disincarnation" of the body politic and the nonidentity of society with itself. In Flynn's words (p. xxii), the significance of Machiavelli for Lefort resided chiefly in the former's insistence "that society is always and everywhere torn by inner conflict" and that the elimination of conflict "is not only impossible but also undesirable." In contrast to Marxist teachings, conflict in Machiavelli's view did not revolve around an economic class struggle, but had a strictly political character, involving the opposition between the desires "to oppress" and "not to be oppressed." Turning to Machiavelli's most famous text, and emphasizing the phenomenological and even ontological dimensions of Lefort's reading, Flynn adds (pp. 8-10) that, in The Prince, politics is constituted "across the play of desires, masking a fundamental void, a noncoincidence of the body politic with itself." In this manner, the text inaugurates "a new ontology and a new political philosophy" that "destabilizes" traditional meanings; far from simply underwriting a "Machiavellian" project, the work in fact "adumbrates a fundamental critique" of that project, a critique which views power "not as a positive object, a sort of thing-in-itself, but rather of a relationship of poles in conflict." Taken in this sense, The Prince (for Lefort) discloses Machiavelli as "the quintessential thinker of modernity," where modernity is neither "the period dominated by the thought of a sovereign subjectivity" nor a simply "classificatory term" but a synonym for the dissolution of traditional "markers of certainty."

It is impossible in this brief review to attend to all the points raised in Lefort's (and Flynn's) discussion of The Prince and The Discourses. Instead, I turn to the more general topic of Lefort's "practice of interpretation." In Flynn's account, Lefort's practice in this regard is clearly distinguished both from Derridean deconstruction and Habermasian rational discourse. As he points out (pp. 65-66) -- using the language of Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty -- Machiavelli's oeuvre for Lefort was not simply a text or discourse but had the character of an "event" or "advent" -- where that term points to an occurrence of "being", a mode of "'there is' (il y a) in which we are irreducibly inscribed." Interpreting such an advent requires a worldly engagement, an attempt to "think in the space which it opens to the thought of others." In contrast to the "authorless" anonymity favored by some postmodernists, Lefort's practice of reading preserves the relevance of the author -- not as an intentional subject (mens auctoris) but as someone opening up a world through his "work" (travail). In opposition to the Habermasian focus on rational validity, Lefort attends to the Merleau-Pontyan "intertwining" of sense and nonsense, reason and nonreason, thus steering a course between ideal finality and randomness. Lefort, Flynn comments (pp. 70-71), finds in the work of Machiavelli an intersection of "knowledge and nonknowledge," a crossing avoiding both "the 'high altitude' thinking of the philosopher king" and "the temporalizing empiricism of the pseudo-sages of Florence." In this manner, his writings exhibit neither a "definitive final meaning" nor a "drifting in a sea of interpretations." Given this stress on the nonfinality of meaning, Flynn finds a certain parallel or "convergence" (p. 72) between Lefort's practice and Gadamerian hermeneutics -- even though the former is much more ready than Gadamer to employ psychoanalytic vocabulary (especially Lacan's triad of the "symbolic," the "imaginary," and the "real").

The core of the book's argument is found in Parts Two and Three, dealing respectively with Lefort's conceptions of premodernity and modernity. As previously indicated, premodern society for Lefort was typically a form of life whose meaning was securely anchored elsewhere, a regime whose symbolic structure was "fixed to nature or to a supersensible world, another place" (p. 100), while remaining aloof from history. Although medieval Christianity adhered to an eschatological vision, this vision was not part of a historical process; at least for mainstream theology, "the signs of providence were not legible within history" (p. 107). Following Ernst Kantorowicz, Lefort's conception of premodernity stresses the role of the king's "two bodies" (empirical and sacred) as representing symbolically society's unity. This unity was shattered by modernity and especially by the succession of modern revolutions. Lefort accepts Alexis de Tocqueville's notion of "the democratic revolution" whose significance resided in the fact that it "snapped the foundations of the distinctions between men in society," distinctions which in earlier times had been "anchored in nature" and/or "sanctified by myth or religion" (p. 120). While undercutting these human distinctions, modernity ushers in novel gaps between appearance and reality, between "imaginary" interpretations and real conditions. Lefort is fond in this context of invoking psychoanalytic terminology. In Flynn's words (p. 125), he is "adamant on the point that within premodern society it is not possible to distinguish the symbolic, the imaginary, and the real; perhaps we could even say that premodernity is the condition in which this distinction is impossible." Differently phrased (pp. 148-149), in premodernity "the religious foundation of power, law, and knowledge is an imaginary interpretation of the symbolic," whereas within modernity "this imaginary interpretation becomes visible as such." With this change comes the distinction between representative "figure" and symbolic "place," a distinction that is not a reversal: for, "although the figure of premodern transcendence is effaced, the place of this transcendence remains as an empty place."

For Lefort, the onset of modernity signals a loss and a gain: it entails a loss of unity and security, but harbors the gain of openness and radical questioning. In opposition to some "unrestrained" antimodernists, Lefort sees the chief gain of modern democracy in "the institution of an interrogation that will call the Law and all authority into question." This gain, Flynn comments (p. 150), "is what we call freedom" seen as "the very condition of the political and of politics." The danger lying at the heart of modernity is the temptation of regression: the temptation to fill up the open space created by democracy with a new type of "incarnation" or definitive unity, especially the imaginary fantasy of the "People-as-One." Yielding to this temptation is the hallmark of "totalitarianism" -- the theme of the concluding Part of the book. Paraphrasing Lefort, Flynn (p. 213) pinpoints the gist of totalitarianism again in the imaginary self-identity of the people, in the "representation of the people-as-one." While self-identity rules out internal strife, radical division emerges between "the inside" and "the outside," between "the people and its enemies." In contrast to purely ideological or "imaginary" treatments of totalitarianism, Lefort places the accent on the "symbolic" dimension of the regime, insisting (p. 241) that totalitarianism is not the "instantiation of an idea, neither the idea of a classless society nor the Fascist idea of a master race," but rather involves a "mutation of the symbolic structure of democracy," namely, "a flight from the empty place that democracy entails." By way of conclusion, Flynn points to one of Lefort's later writings (La complication, 1999) which reflected on the implications of totalitarianism for the "constitution of a world space." As that text notes (p. 268), the formation of such a space would entail "a total mastery of human relations under the sign of the One," thus conjuring up not an "interdependence of states" or societies but a complete "unification of the globe."

Flynn is to be congratulated for presenting a well crafted, lucidly written introduction to this important political thinker. Actually, his book contains a number of additional features which I had to bypass for the sake of brevity. Among these features is the discussion of the relation between "modernity and law" -- where Lefort stresses the rule-governed character of democracy even in the absence of an ultimate anchor -- and the relation between "modernity and rights" -- where Lefort emphasizes the political and symbolic (rather than purely moral) character of rights. Valuable are also Flynn's comparisons between Lefort and other prominent political thinkers, like Leo Strauss and Hannah Arendt. With regard to the character of modernity, Arendt saw the distinguishing trait in the "rise of the social" and the eclipse of politics by "labor" and "work," while Strauss located the basic change in the demise of classical "natural right" and the upsurge of history and political "science." While appreciating some of his insights, Lefort (pp. 152-158) takes exception to several of Strauss's arguments: including the confusion of history with historicism, the tendency to equate critique with relativism, and the unwillingness to recognize modern democracy as a distinctive political "regime." Regarding Arendt, the differences are more nuanced and have to do mainly with their respective conceptions of totalitarianism. For Arendt, totalitarianism was basically a product, or at least a byproduct, of modernity's accent on the "social" and the incessant movement of labor's life cycle. For Lefort, by contrast, the same phenomenon signals a perversion of modernity's disincarnation of social unity. In Flynn's account (pp. xxviii-xxix), Lefort diverges from Arendt mainly on two points: first, the strain in her thought "which suggests that totalitarianism is 'the denouement of modernity'"; and secondly, the exaggerated role attributed to motion or mobility which underestimates "the stabilizing role of the One in the totalitarian regime."

Despite its merits, the book is not free of flaws and at some points invites critical afterthoughts. Some purely technical flaws must be attributed to the editor at the press: Schleiermacher appears as "Schreimacher" (p. 124); Tocqueville is once called "Alexander de" (p. 154); and Rorty's book Achieving Our Country is repeatedly cited as Achieving Our Century (pp. xix, xxix). Other questions, however, can be addressed to the author. In the discussion of Machiavelli, one misses a sustained comparison of Lefort's "practice of reading" with the interpretations offered, for example, in Strauss's Thoughts on Machiavelli and John Pocock's The Machiavellian Moment. On many other occasions, one misses a certain critical engagement with Lefort's work. In the comparison between Arendt and Lefort on the issue totalitarianism, Flynn clearly sides with the French thinker. However, one might wonder -- with Arendt -- whether the upsurge of totalitarianism is not attributable, at least in part, to certain tendencies inherent in modernity, including subjectivism, voluntarism, and rampant will to power (today manifest on the global level). More generally, questions can be raised concerning Lefort's equation of modernity with radical disincarnation and of democracy's legitimacy with an "empty place." Surely, between the "people-as-one" and the "people-as-no one" there is a vast spectrum of possibilities; above all, modern democracy still is sustained by "people" (even if ontologically nonidentical) nurtured by certain historical experiences and animated by ethical and political aspirations. This cultural and "civil society" dimension cannot be irrelevant, and actually seems crucial, to the legitimacy of democratic regimes. In this domain, I feel, Lefort tends to give undue precedence to Aron's liberalism over Merleau-Ponty's notion of the "flesh" of the political; in addition, certain linguistic teachings (deriving from Saussure and Lacan) sometimes trump his hermeneutical sensibilities. Without neglecting the liberal stand, one may wish to upgrade phenomenology in this equation in order to "humanize" the emptiness of democracy and salvage a measure of democratic legitimacy.