The Philosophy of David Kaplan

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Joseph Almog and Paolo Leonardi (eds.), The Philosophy of David Kaplan, Oxford UP, 2009, 324pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195367881.

Reviewed by Robert van Rooij, Universiteit van Amsterdam



David Kaplan is certainly one of the most influential philosophers of the last 50 years, and this book is a very interesting collection of articles by mostly prominent philosophers focusing both on Kaplan’s own innovations in the philosophy of language and philosophical logic, as well as further reflections on these themes.

Kaplan is perhaps best known for his work on de re belief attributions (in “Quantifying in”), the semantics of indexicals and demonstratives (in “Demonstratives”), and the paradox of possible world semantics named after him. Indeed, most of the papers in this volume deal with these issues. But especially in the second chapter of the book, due to Anthony Anderson, it becomes clear that Kaplan contributed much more. Relatively well known among modern philosophers is his joint work on semantic paradoxes with Richard Montague, and his work on the relation between a Churchian conception of sense and denotation and a Russelian one. The information that Kaplan also wrote some important papers on theories of explanation was completely new to me. Most important of all, of course, this whole book accentuates once more that Kaplan was one of the founders of the direct theory of reference, and as such one of the most influential proponents of modern essentialism and the anti-Cartesian externalistic picture of meaning and intentionality.

The first three papers of the book, by Joseph Almog, Anthony Anderson and Nathan Salmon, deal with Kaplan’s life and work. I found them very interesting, especially because they give a nice impression of the man (Kaplan) and the atmosphere created by such important founders of philosophical logic at UCLA (e.g., Carnap, Church, Montague, Kamp) and around it (e.g., van Fraassen) during the sixties and the beginning of the seventies.

This book contains two papers about Kaplan’s paradox of possible world semantics. They are also the two most technical papers in it. Kaplan argues that the following principle appears to be logically consistent: For any proposition p, it is possible that the thinker entertains the proposition at time t and that p is the only proposition that he entertains at that time. However, Kaplan shows that this principle gives rise to the paradoxical conclusion that there are as many possible worlds as there are propositions (i.e., sets of possible worlds). He suggests as a solution ramification (propositions are hierarchically ordered and propositional quantifiers used in any proposition range only over lower levels of the hierarchy) because his paradox is closely related to the liar. Both Anthony Anderson and Sten Lindström argue that ramification is too costly and suggest alternatives. Anderson comes close to arguing that Kaplan’s principle is logically inconsistent after all, while Lindström’s proposal is closer to ramification in suggesting that the domain over which propositional quantifiers range is restricted. For Lindström, the reason for this restriction is the context dependence of the (propositional) quantifiers, and not their type. In this sense, Lindström makes use of a two-dimensional semantics developed by Kaplan for other purposes to solve his own problem.

The papers by Terence Parsons and by Christopher Peacocke discuss the hierarchy of senses. It is well known that according to Frege the embedded sentence in “Mary believes φ” refers to its sense, rather than its standard referent (its truth value). But what then does φ refer to in the sentence “John thinks that Mary believes that φ”? A straightforward generalization of the Fregean reasoning suggests that it can’t just be the ordinary sense of φ, and it in fact must be the sense of the sense of φ. If this reasoning is accepted, however, Frege seems to be committed to the existence of a hierarchy of senses: the doctrine that each expression must have associated with it not just one sense, but an infinite number of them. This seems problematic, for instance because it suggests that even very simple languages are impossible to learn. A natural reaction would be to propose that for any expression α, the sense of α is identical to the sense of the sense of α. Peacocke argues against this proposal, and Parsons even shows formally that it leads to disaster. What both authors conclude is that such a Fregean hierarchy does indeed exist. However, they propose (which I take to be the obvious reaction in this framework) that this does not lead to any problem, because for any expression α, the sense of the sense of … α is functionally dependent on the sense of … α. Both authors motivate this solution by comparing it to Kaplan’s own use of standard names to account for quantifying in. Working myself in the framework of possible worlds semantics, I have to admit that I can’t make much sense of the problem, but I can imagine that these papers are interesting if we take Frege very seriously.

According to the traditional internalist conception of intentionality, a proper name is about an individual if we associate with that proper name a list of predicates that single out this individual as its unique reference. In the spirit of this conception, in his famous paper on quantifying in, Kaplan tried to reduce Ralph’s de re belief about Ortcutt that he is a spy to a better understood de dicto belief. Kaplan’s requirement for the belief to be about Ortcutt was for Ralph to be acquainted with Ortcutt. In a rather long paper, Tyler Burge argues against the Russellian thesis that acquaintance should play this important role. Similarly, Robert Stalnaker convincingly argues that a Russellian acquaintance relation is much too demanding for having a belief about a particular individual; Ralph can have a de re belief about Hillary just because he has heard of her via a news item. But next he points out that Kaplan’s use of the traditional conception of intentionality by thinking of acquaintance in terms of having a vivid name of the object the belief is about is by itself already problematic. Such a vivid name is a kind of description, which involves predicates, but this only gives rise to the question of what these predicates themselves are about. In line with the theory of direct reference and an externalistic view of intentionality, Stalnaker argues that in giving a belief attribution we try to characterize how the agent sees the world using resources we find in the world as we take it to be.

Very similar in spirit to Stalnaker’s paper is the contribution of Erin L. Eaker. According to a first natural analysis of belief sentences, “John believes that φ” is true iff John would sincerely assert to himself: “φ”. Although everybody will give up on this idea on second thought, something like this idea has given rise to finer and finer-grained conceptions of content (of belief). Eaker rightly points out that belief attributions are not always used in order to characterize the belief state of the agent as the agent sees it herself, i.e. from an internalist perspective. Of course, due to the existence of de re belief attributions everybody knows this, but Eaker still argues that it is exactly the misconception that they do that has given rise to all these well-known puzzles of belief. I completely agree: once we realize that attitude attributions are not exclusively made to explain the agent’s behavior, but can serve all types of pragmatic services, and can also be used, for instance, to influence the audience, the traditional puzzles about belief don’t necessarily force one to adopt very fine-grained conceptions of content and belief. I also agree with Eaker (and David Lewis) that Kripke’s puzzle of belief is most naturally explained in terms of de re belief attributions (even if Kripke doesn’t like this).

The shortest paper of the book is by Stavroula Glezakos. Short, but nice. The author argues that Frege could, in fact, not pose Frege’s puzzle. The puzzle was of course to explain the difference in cognitive status of “a = a” versus “a = b”. The obvious solution seems to be that in contrast to the second, the same name is used two times in the first case. This, however, raises the question what it is for two names to be ‘the same’. Sameness of type of linguistic expression is obviously too coarse-grained, but sameness of token is much too fine-grained. If it also involves the relation between the occurrence of the term and the referent, the difference in cognitive status cannot be explained. Glezakos provides contextual evidence that according to Frege, one name is the same as another iff they both have the same sense. But if that is so, Frege’s puzzle does not even arise!

It is well known that Kaplan (in “Demonstratives”) gave a clear and convincing semantics of indexicals like “I” and “now”. John Perry reminds us that in the same work Kaplan also discusses true demonstratives like “that” and “he” and that Kaplan recognized that their semantics is not as straightforward. The reason is that the referent of the speaker’s use of a demonstrative, thought of as a type of expression, can be very much undetermined by the context, if it consists — as Kaplan argued — just of me, now, here and this world. Following some suggestions of Kaplan’s “Afterthoughts”, and based on a very detailed discussion of some intricate examples, Perry argues that the directing intention that accompanies the use of a demonstrative should be part of the character (and not the content) of the demonstrative. Moreover, he makes the completely natural (though perhaps not very popular) suggestion that such an account should be used not only for demonstrative, but also for anaphoric, pronouns. Although I like Perry’s suggestion, it has to be admitted that it sounds rather different from what Kaplan did with indexicals. Kaplan provided a theory of type of expressions. Adopting Perry’s suggestion for demonstratives, it comes much closer to a theory that provides a meaning to tokens of expressions.

The papers of Edward Keenan, Timothy Williamson, and Kit Fine are less closely related to the work of Kaplan, and to the other papers in the volume. Keenan gives a detailed overview of the theory of generalized quantifiers, to which he is one of the most important contributors. Although the theory of generalized quantifiers is perhaps of interest mostly to linguists and logicians, it also has philosophical impact. Perhaps this is mainly due to the fact that Russell’s idea that the syntax of natural language is misleading — which was so influential in early analytic philosophy — has lost almost all support among natural language semanticists.

Timothy Williamson argues that pejoratives expressions, like “Boche” (for “German”), poses a problem for an inferentialist conception of meaning. According to this latter conception, the meaning of expressions can be given in terms of the way we reason with them, in terms of elimination and introduction rules. According to an elimination rule on one such proposal (due to Dummett), we can infer from “x is a Boche” to “x is cruel”. Yet, as Williamson points out, someone might perfectly well understand the word “Boche” without ever making the above inference. Williamson proposes that it is much better to treat the insulting part of a pejorative as a Gricean conventional implicature. This allows “Boche” and “German” to have the same semantic (denotational) meaning, but still can explain why the use of the different expressions give rise to different inferences. The solution of Williamson’s paper will not be very surprising to linguists, but his use of pejoratives to argue against an inferential account of meaning is innovative.

The focus of Kit Fine’s paper is on the meaning of variables. He argues that no existing account can explain why the semantic role of the variables x and y is the same in the sentences “x > 0” and “y > 0”, but different in the sentences “x > y” and “x > x”. He argues that in order to assign semantic values to expressions we should also take account of semantic relationships between expressions that may not be grounded in their intrinsic semantic features (what the expression all by itself [might] refer to). As a result, semantics should be concerned not only with the assignment of semantic values, but also with the assignment of semantic connections. Fine works out his ideas by giving a connectionistic semantics for first-order logic, and suggests that it might have implications for how to deal with, for example, Frege’s puzzle: why “a = a” might have a different cognitive status than “a = b”.

This book is called The Philosophy of David Kaplan. I am not sure whether I now know better what his philosophy is. I don’t think David Kaplan would mind; what is important is problems, not solutions. The articles in this book make clear that the problems discussed and brought up by David Kaplan are still worth thinking about.