The Philosophy of Deception

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Clancy Martin (ed.), The Philosophy of Deception, Oxford UP, 2009, 282pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195327939.

Reviewed by Dion Scott-Kakures, Scripps College



This elegant volume collects fourteen essays that take up, in a wide array of contexts, the issues of deception, self-deception, lying and various other forms of dissimulation. It is an impressive addition to a growing body of work on these topics. With the exception of an assemblage of previously published work by Harry Frankfurt, the essays have not been previously published.1 Part I is titled “The Practices of Deception and Self-Deception” and Part II is titled “Truth, Lies, and Self-Deception: The Theory and The Ethics.” The editor writes that while the essays of Part I take up the “how” of deception and self-deception and the ways in which these are “actually carried out in human life” (5), the essays of Part II “tend to be more concerned with the theoretical philosophical debates in the literature on deception and self-deception” (ibid.). Perhaps almost inevitably — especially given the subject matter — this distinction is not always so clear.

More helpful, I think, is the editor’s noting that he was motivated to collect such work by virtue of his conviction that the investigations of lying and other-deception in general on the one hand, and of self-deception on the other, have been, more or less, pursued independently of each other and that “both could benefit from a sustained examination of the many traits they have in common, of the ways they work together, of similarities and differences in their structure, their practice, their ethics” (4). As Martin puts the point when discussing Alfred Mele’s contribution to the volume, "although [Mele] thinks the analogy of self-deception with deception is an unhelpful one, I think his essay shows us just the opposite: His understanding of self-deception can provide us with a more helpful analogy with deception" (p. 11).2 I take it that, if this is so, it is because on Mele’s influential deflationary account of the phenomenon, self-deception typically involves neither an intention to deceive (oneself) nor simultaneous belief in p and not-p. Self-deception is, rather, a matter of motivationally biased belief-formation. If, as Martin suggests, this analogy offers a better understanding of interpersonal deception, then presumably interpersonal deception is less (or less frequently than we are apt to suppose) a matter of my intentionally bringing it about that you believe that p, while myself smugly believing that not-p, than it is a matter of my being moved by motivational and affective states to distort and mislead in ways that answer to my (and, very often, our mutual) interests. It’s rare for collections such as this to have so clearly articulated an editorial aim; it is also, of course, most welcome.

The first essay of the volume, the late Robert Solomon’s “Self, Deception, and Self-Deception in Philosophy,” succeeds as an introduction to these themes. Solomon seeks to emphasize the varied ways in which deception and self-deception work together as a “dynamic social” phenomenon (24). Here, Solomon works to show that we go wrong if we think of self-deception as an internal and solitary version of interpersonal deception, and even more so if we think of the deception of others as chiefly a matter of carrying out “malicious” and “fully intentional” lying (ibid.). Rather, what “we are after,” he insists,

is a … drama of truth and falsehood in the complex social and emotional webs we weave, compared to which what is often singled out as ‘the lie’ tends to become an ethical exception of comparatively little interest (ibid.).

Solomon notes that we are too keen to value the truth and too ready to condemn the propagation of untruth. “Deception is sometimes not a vice,” he writes, “but a social virtue” (22). There is much along the way, and not surprisingly, that is reminiscent of Goffman’s The Presentation of Self in Everyday Life. (For example, “As often as not, deception and self-deception combine to form the most sincere belief among coconspirators, not victim and villain” 27.) It seems to me that while there’s much to be appreciated here, much might have been made of the distinction between acceptance as opposed to belief in covering this ground. When Solomon writes that our “ideas about our selves and our place in the world are not truths but experiments” (36) and when he writes of “commitment” (31) this would appear to be usefully regarded as acceptance rather than belief.3 In this regard it’s worth noting that, early in the essay, Solomon writes that “philosophers generally deceive themselves and try to deceive others about the superiority of this school or that method” (18). Here, especially, the notion of acceptance seems helpful, since it isn’t at all apparent that philosophers, generally, believe the positions they defend (against all comers). Moreover, while we can certainly agree that high-minded moralizing can (no doubt, via a form of self-deception) seduce us into an overvaluing of truth and truthfulness, surely it’s possible to err in the contrary direction.4

It’s bracing, then, that selections from Frankfurt’s work follow Solomon’s essay. This will be familiar terrain for many. Even so, Frankfurt’s emphasis on the liar as seeking to impose his will upon us by putting us into a world of his fancy, and foreclosing a presumed “form of human intimacy” (42), serves as an antidote to a too ready acquiescence to the liar’s aims. And, of course, in these selections we have Frankfurt’s notable account of bullshit and the bullshitter. When the bullshitter utters “p”, it needn’t be the case that not-p nor need the bullshitter believe that not-p. The bullshitter, thus, neither necessarily misrepresents the world nor her beliefs; rather, she misrepresents what she is up to — the motive “guiding and controlling [her speech] is unconcerned with how the things about which she speaks truly are” (46). In this way, then, while the liar remains hostage to the truth as a standard, the bullshitter is blithely unconcerned with truth and falsity. This is why, for Frankfurt, “bullshit is a greater enemy of the truth than lies are” (48).

While these first two contributions serve to deliver very different accounts of the nature and status of deceived and deceiver, the remaining contributions of Part I serve to underscore the surprisingly varied domains in which the issues of deception and self-deception are engaged. William Ian Miller’s “Deceit in War and Trade,” is a rich source of many examples of deceit throughout history and a provocative reflection on the ways and whys of our frequent admiration of the deceiver or trickster. This is, in part, because the deceiver makes the fool pay for his “greed” and “vanity” (56). In this way, the successful deceiver often exploits our tendency to be self-deceived. The essay, as well, offers much by way of a nuanced account of the role of deceit in competitive settings (war, love, sport, commerce), and, so, makes for a useful run-up to the reader’s encounter, later in the volume, with Alan Strudler’s defense of morally acceptable self-defensive deception.

Mark A. Wrathall’s “On the ‘Existential Positivity of Our Ability to Be Deceived’” takes up the matter of deception in a very different context: “the existential-phenomenological treatment of the phenomenon of perceptual deception” (68). Wrathall’s investigation considers the work of Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty on the nature and significance of “perceptual deception” with an eye to addressing how it is that

It is only because we believe in a set of determinate, objective facts about the perceived world, and only because we believe that the way the world seems to us is equally objective and determinate — that it makes sense to treat the success or failure of perception as a matter of truth or falsity (69-70).

David Sherman’s “Self-Deception, Deception and the Way of the World” begins with a worry about the current neglect of the “social component” of self-deception and goes on to develop a demanding view of sociohistorical truth and deception (drawing, especially, on Hegel), according to which we must take care to distinguish between first-order beliefs and belief-formation and second-order beliefs and belief-formation. In “Duplicity Makes the Man or Can Animals Lie?” Kelly Oliver begins by reflecting on the role of the unconscious in the geography of deception. A bit hyperbolically, perhaps, she writes that “Insofar as unconscious forces drive us beyond our control and even beyond our knowledge, then we are all and always a bunch of liars” (104). Still, she’s chiefly interested here in the appeal to various continuities and discontinuities between human beings and animals in Lacan’s work and, in particular, in the alleged ways in which our capacity for speech may make certain forms of deception a distinctively human preserve.

Paul Ekman’s “Lie Catching and ”SpellE">Microexpressions" is devoted to the largely evolutionary, psychological explanation of why it is that lie-catching and lying are “poorly developed skills” in human beings (118). Ekman reports here as well on some of his fascinating research concerning microfacial expressions and on our ability, with relatively little training, to detect these expressions of suppressed or concealed emotions. Of note, as well, is Ekman’s effort to distinguish between lying and other forms of deception — the liar “deliberately chooses to mislead” and conceals from the deceived his intention to deceive. Moreover, Ekman denies a traditional view that only “false statements” or other symbolic communications can be lies (119). (His example concerns concealment in the matter of intentionally failing to list a past employer on a job application that requires one to respond to the query “List all past employers.” Arguably, one’s intentionally incomplete answer in reply to that query is a false statement. Still, one sees the point.)

Part II of the volume begins with Studler’s very fine “Deception and Trust.” His point of departure is Bernard Williams’ two-fold answer (in Truth and Truthfulness5) to the question “What is the wrong in or of deception?” Strudler notes that Williams’ answer is both (1) that the deceiver breaches a trust with the deceived and (2) that the deceiver manipulates the deceived. What, he asks, is the relationship between these answers? Strudler’s reply, too briefly, is that while a “breach of trust is a kind of manipulation,” not all manipulative deception involves a breach of trust (139). One noteworthy upshot of this is that deception via a breach of trust is, generally, worse morally than deception by means of other forms of manipulation (152). Strudler’s beginnings of an account of what is sufficient for manipulation is that “one person manipulates another when he intentionally causes that person to behave as he wishes through a chain of events that has the desired effect only because the manipulated person is unaware of that chain” (140).6 Making use of a number of striking examples, Strudler argues that there are cases of deception in which a breach of trust and manipulation pull apart. This will be so, Strudler alleges, when, for example, I know you don’t trust me but secure your reliance on my credibility by pointing to some “external basis [e.g., my self-interest] for my truthfulness” (143). Where such an external basis for reliance is made known, I might exploit that in order to deceive you. I manipulate you, of course, but not by a breach of trust. As Strudler notes, this is to conceive of trust as a matter of goodwill (141), and more than a few will dispute that goodwill is required for what is appropriately termed “trust” to be present in communicative contexts.

Of much related interest is Strudler’s discussion of the conditions in which deceptive acts may be morally acceptable by virtue of the defensive function they serve in certain contexts. This nicely anticipates David Sussman’s discussion, later in the volume, of Kant’s account of the self-defensive lie (229). Strudler develops an analogy between the use of force to defend oneself against physical harm and the use of deception to defend oneself against a query that threatens economic loss. The conditions that Strudler develops are nuanced and complex; still, the discussion leaves unanswered some questions regarding the sorts of harm that we may acceptably seek to avoid by acts of self-defensive deception. Charles Taylor, for example, notes that a new understanding of identity has allowed us to comprehend that “misrecognition” is a harm.7 Might we, in morally acceptable fashion, act deceptively in order to avoid such a harm?

Thomas Carson’s “Lying, Deception, and Related Concepts” is something of a tour de force of philosophical analysis. Carson’s final definition of lying is:

L5. A person S tells a lie to another person S1 iff: 1. S makes a false statement x to S1, 2. S believes that x is false or probably false (or, alternatively, S doesn’t believe that x is true), 3. S states x in a context in which S thereby warrants the truth of x to S1, and 4. S does not take herself not to be warranting the truth of what she says to S1. (171)

There are many noteworthy aspects and implications of the definition — for example, the intent to deceive is not necessary for lying on this definition (159-61). The notion of warrant is of particular interest. To warrant the truth of a statement is to promise or guarantee “either explicitly or implicitly, that what one says is true” (167). On Carson’s account a speaker can warrant a statement without intending to do so and whether a statement is warranted is independent of whether the individuals who are addressed believe that the “speaker (writer) warrants its truth to them” (169).8

Carson, then, turns to the matters of deception, misleading, withholding information, keeping others in the dark, and to a critical appreciation of Frankfurt’s account of bullshit — and there’s much here that re-pays careful study. He writes that “deception requires some kind of intention to cause others to have false beliefs” and goes on to say that it is “self-contradictory to say that someone deceived another person unintentionally” (177). Hence, Carson notes that we should speak of “misleading” others in cases in which we unintentionally cause them to have false beliefs. I am not sure that there is compelling reason to hold that the “deceive”/“mislead” distinction tracks the intentional/unintentional causing-to-believe-false distinction. Certainly, we can grant that to accuse someone of “deception” is to hold them accountable and, so, typically to presume intentional or deliberate deceptive behavior. But even forgetting about the fact that we speak easily of being deceived by natural phenomena, one can certainly negligently and unintentionally deceive. This is, as I hope is clear, a rich and rewarding essay.

Michael Lynch’s “Deception and the Nature of Truth,” offers an inventive and arresting account of the ways in which “the conceptual linkage between deception and truth can, and should, affect how we think about the metaphysics of truth” (197) and about the value of truth. For Lynch, it is possible to say rather more about truth than, say, deflationists would have us believe, if we mine the role that truth plays in our cognitive economy (200). In order to do that, he notes, close attention must be devoted to the relation of the concept of truth to the notions of “deception, ignorance, objectivity, value” (199). James Mahon’s “The Truth about Kant on Lies” and David Sussman’s “On the Supposed Duty of Truthfulness: Kant on Lying in Self-Defense” are contributions to the on-going and fertile investigation of Kant’s apparently quite uncompromising - indeed zealot-like - regard for the immorality of lying in his moral philosophy and, especially, in his late “On a Supposed right to Lie from Philanthropy.” Mahon develops, in very great detail, Kant’s distinctions between a lie in the ethical sense, in the juristic sense, and in the sense of right. These distinctions, along with close attention to what Kant has to say about “white lies” and lies to oneself (207), go some distance, Mahon argues, to mitigating the alleged repugnance of Kant’s claims. Sussman’s essay (which is graceful and stylish and, so, a pleasure to read) provides much by way of historical background to Kant’s essay and develops with great attention the resources Kant may (and may not) have available in understanding a lie to the murderer at the door as self-defensive.

The collection ends with two essays on self-deception: Amelie Rorty’s “User-Friendly Self-Deception: A Traveler’s Manuel” and Alfred Mele’s “Have I Unmasked Self-Deception or Am I Self-Deceived?” Rorty’s essay returns to themes introduced by Solomon’s essay, arguing that “deception and self-deception are not merely detached conclusions of invalid arguments: they are interactive processes with a complex cognitive and affective ”SpellE">aetiology" (247). Self-deception is social and collusive, and there are benefits and beneficiaries of its successful practice.

Mele’s essay is an impressively economical introduction to his deflationary account of self-deception and to his appeal to contemporary psychological accounts of lay hypothesis-testing in the characterization of that account. As will be familiar to many, self-deception for Mele is a matter of motivationally biased belief acquisition or retention. His account is, then, in stark contrast to traditionalist accounts according to which the self-deceiver intends his own deception and, at least for a time, believes both that p and that not-p. These untoward commitments of a traditionalist account of self-deception are the result of modeling self-deception on prototypical cases of other-deception. Here Mele chiefly aims to reply to a number of recent objections to his sparse account of self-deception: (1) that self-deception in believing that p requires appeal to a desire to believe that p is true; (2) that a “failure of self-knowledge” is an essential element of robust self-deception; and (3) that self-deception typically involves the possession of a false second-order belief. The essay is, I think, notable not just by virtue of Mele’s persuasive replies to the objections but also for the way in which it puts the reader in command of an entire, enormous literature.

It’s more or less typical to end such reviews with remarks such as “This is arguably the finest collection on the topic available today” or “There’s no doubt that this volume will be of very great interest to anyone who works in ethics, action theory, and moral psychology.” But it’s tempting, after having spent some time with this volume, to worry about and to wonder if the writing of such things is just more collusive self-deception and deception. After all, there are many motives at work (cognitive dissonance in various forms, your expectations, etc.), and we all know how this review business typically goes. Still, I do believe the remarks in quotation marks above. Seriously.

1 Alan Strudler’s contribution to the volume is a revised version of a previously published essay and much of Thomas Carson’s contribution is drawn from previously published work.

2 Strictly speaking, Mele takes the modeling of self-deception on other-deception to be “unhelpful” if it assumed that other-deception must involve both the deceiver’s believing (truly) that p and intentionally deceiving the victim to believe that not-p.

3 See, for example, Michael Bratman, “Practical Reasoning and Acceptance in a Context,” in Faces of Intention: Selected Essays on Intention and Agency, (Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 1999).

4 I’m reminded, in this regard, of the final lines of Ian Hacking’s Rewriting the Soul: Multiple Personality and the Sciences of Memory, (Princeton: Princeton UP, 1995), when he writes that “false consciousness is contrary to the growth and maturing of a person who knows herself. It is contrary to what the philosophers call freedom. It is contrary to our best vision of what it is to be a human being” (267). Perhaps this is just more high-minded moralizing; still, as a regulative ideal, it’s hard to beat.

5 (Princeton: Princeton UP, 2002.)

6 As Strudler notes, there are of course other forms of manipulation that, “preying on a person’s emotions, may be transparent to their victims” (n.2, 140). One can, as well, manipulate by means of the use of another’s psychic weaknesses, as when you, wanting me to miss an appointment and knowing of my obsessive-compulsiveness with regard to such matters, ask me if I’m “really sure” that I locked the front door, which causes me to return home and so miss the appointment. The account would also appear to make room for morally unobjectionable forms of manipulation, as when for example one produces delight and thanks in a child by giving her a surprise party. It’s not implausible, though, that for many adults it’s precisely the manipulative aspect of such “happy surprises” that renders their prospect a source of dread.

7 In Multiculturalism: Examining the Politics of Recognition, (Princeton: Princeton UP, 1994). Another, different sort of case, might be drawn from the Lewinsky Affair. President Clinton at a press conference, in 1998, famously said "I did not have sexual relations with that woman, Miss Lewinsky." If we stipulate, for the sake of argument, that he wasn’t lying but rather deceiving his audience, might we conclude that this was a morally acceptable act of deception in response to untoward queries and in defense of something like self-respect?

8 One result of this is that it makes it possible to lie unintentionally (170); it’s for this reason that Carson adds condition (4) above.