The Philosophy of Early Christianity

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George Karamanolis, The Philosophy of Early Christianity, Acumen, 2013, 317pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781844655687.

Reviewed by Johannes Zachhuber, University of Oxford


The relationship of nascent Christian theology to ancient philosophy has frequently been investigated yet remains one of the least understood problems of early Christian thought. This is partly due to the inadequacy of the terminology that is often used: a duality of 'theology' and 'philosophy' as two separate disciplines is a creation of the medieval university which, if read back into late antiquity, distorts the picture from the outset. That George Karamanolis chooses a very different approach is apparent from his title, and his book deserves attention if only for that reason. His aim is to present the 'philosophy' of Early Christianity. In other words, he considers Christian thinkers in late antiquity as philosophers and seeks to describe their intellectual contribution in this framework. The result is a highly original book which ought to be taken seriously by both philosophers of antiquity and Patristic scholars. It offers plenty of valuable insight, and even where its claims may not altogether stand up to scrutiny, they inevitably provide fresh and stimulating insights.

Given that it is far from accepted that early Christianity can be seen to have developed a philosophy of its own, Karamanolis devotes the first chapter to a justification of his approach. His main line of argument is a defence against the suspicion that Christianity, far from having instituted a kind of philosophy, was, at least initially, a cultural force hostile to philosophy. He seeks to demonstrate that early Christian discourse had an essentially philosophical nature. Karamanolis points out that even where Christian authors polemicize against 'the' philosophers, they often do so with weapons culled from the philosophical arsenal. Thus, he demonstrates that the argument frequently used by Christian authors that philosophers must be wrong because they disagree amongst themselves replicates a claim first developed by the sceptics (36). He recognises that Christian claims about the fullness of truth being revealed in Scripture and in the person of Jesus Christ go against the principle upheld by many philosophers of the fundamental openness of philosophical enquiry, but he points to mitigating factors such as the principal acceptance by many philosophers of school teachings and the factual openness of much Christian debate. Karamanolis is perhaps a bit too dismissive of the significance of Christian references to Scripture as normative, but he is right to point out that Scripture as an agreed point of reference prompted argument rather than curtailed it.

Karamanolis makes the very interesting suggestion that the flourishing of philosophical scepticism in the first centuries after Christ may have contributed to the emergence of a Christian philosophy because Christian thinkers felt the need to maintain the possibility of knowledge against its philosophical denial (11-12).

Ultimately, his claim that Christianity produced a philosophy rests on the observation that Christian authors negotiated their doctrinal claims by means of argument. He shows that in doing so they followed a methodology that has close parallels in other ancient philosophical authors. One of the book's most obvious strengths is that by contextualising Christian discourse within ancient philosophy, Karamanolis is able to draw attention to aspects of Christian literature that otherwise go unnoticed. He reads these authors, as it were, with the eyes of a philosopher; this alone makes the exercise worthwhile.

Karamanolis  carries out this philosophical project out in the five main chapters, examining Christian discussions of physics, metaphysics and cosmology; logic and epistemology; free will and divine providence; psychology; and ethics and politics. What emerges in every single case is that a wide range of Christian thinkers are found to engage in debates about questions such as the origin of the world and the role of matter, the nature of the soul and its relation to the body, the possibility of free will, and virtues and the good life. Obviously, these are all problems well known to students of ancient philosophy. What Karamanolis seeks to show is that Christian discussions were: not purely derivative from pagan philosophical ideas, not degenerate versions of those ideas, and not part of a discourse that was altogether alien to the various schools of ancient philosophy. In other words, the early Christian authors were neither 'Platonists for the people' nor were they anti-philosophers. Instead, they worked on their own distinctive philosophical vision which can and should be understood as another form of philosophy, not its opposite

Karamanolis is not indiscriminate in his assessment of early Christian authors as philosophers. While his analysis leads him to discern philosophical arguments in a wide range of thinkers (from Justin Martyr and the other apologists to Irenaeus, Tertullian, Clement and Origen, to Basil of Caesarea and Gregory of Nyssa in the late fourth century), he is clear that during those centuries only two developed a full philosophical system: Origen and Gregory of Nyssa. Karamanolis  holds that those two each made a genuine attempt to create 'a new philosophical outlook' (239).  He doesn't develop  this important insight in great depth since it is outside the thematic focus of his book.

Karamanolis' approach in many ways determines the questions he asks as well as those he doesn't ask. Since his aim is to defend Christian authors against the charge that they were not 'real' philosophers, his main emphasis is to show how they espoused specific philosophical positions, argued for them, criticised their opponents and defended their own views. This is done on the basis of an impressive knowledge of Patristic texts as well as ancient philosophy more generally. Karamanolis is at his best where he connects Patristic debates to philosophical controversies of the time. In those passages the book moves way beyond the well-worn tendency in Patristic research to research the 'background' of theological controversies in certain philosophical ideas, let alone the traditional Quellenforschung that was content to identify texts a certain Christian author would have known or may have used. The progress can be described by emphasising once again that Karamanolis departs from the conventional dualism of philosophy and theology in favour of a treatment of Christian authors as philosophers. The value of this conceptual decision is particularly borne out in his discussion of Christian debates about topics such as the origin of matter or free will.

At the same time, his specific approach also determines that there are questions Karamanolis does not ask or discuss in any detail. Granted, one might say, that Christian thinkers discussed philosophical ideas in their own way, but how does that constitute a Christian philosophy rather than a range of Christian Platonists, Stoics or eclectics? Is there anything specific within Christianity that necessitated the development of precisely these philosophical notions and, even more, particular philosophical fields of enquiry? There surely are reasons for Christian interest in free will, for example, or the problem of the soul: free will comes into play in the context of debates about divine grace and salvation; the nature of the soul and its immortality are often brought up together with the idea of the resurrection of the dead. We can see at this point where the emphasis on Christian thinkers as philosophers produces a certain one-sidedness: it omits the 'theological' context within which, of course, many or most of these debates took place. What Karamanolis' account obscures, perhaps inevitably, is that Christian authors usually reflect on philosophical problems with goals that would have seemed entirely alien to their non-Christian contemporaries, such as the doctrine of the Trinity or the need to interpret difficult biblical passages. While he is right to observe that those doctrines or the authority of Scripture provided a starting point for philosophical discussion, no understanding of Christian philosophy in late antiquity will be complete without the recognition of the extent to which they shaped and determined such things as the questions Christian authors asked, answers they would find acceptable and lines of enquiry they would pursue or ignore.

Does this bring back the dualism of philosophy and theology? Not necessarily, but one might have to accept that doctrinal debates were quasi-philosophical and be willing to discover philosophical insights in exegetical texts. It is no criticism of Karamanolis' book to say that he has not done that. But it is important to recognise that by presenting Christian thinkers as participating in ancient philosophical debates, he leaves open the question of whether Christian thought in its entirety can be understood as philosophical. On the basis of Karamanolis' book, one could still answer in the negative and consider the evidence he presents indicative of the presence of philosophical reflection within a wider intellectual framework that itself cannot be called philosophy. To affirm that the early Christian authors were philosophers, on the other hand, would arguably mean accepting their thought as a philosophy sui generis, a philosophy unlike any other that is known throughout antiquity.

This idiosyncratic character of Christian philosophy is perhaps most strongly apparent from the way the Church functioned as the institutional framework of Patristic debates. For this, the philosophical schools offer only a remote parallel. Early in the book, Karamanolis justifies limiting the period he investigates to essentially pre-Nicene Christianity with only a few excursions into the fourth century. I don't wish to query the legitimacy of this decision, but it is interesting that Karamanolis' argument for this limitation is the increasing influence of 'ecclesiastical and political authority' after Constantine (27). This, of course, is in many ways true, and it is also accurate to observe that independent lay thinkers like Clement of Alexandria or Tertullian would be hard to imagine from the fourth century onwards. Yet it does not seem to follow that Christian philosophy for that reason receded into the background. In many ways it surely blossomed and became much more refined and sophisticated in thinkers as diverse as Gregory of Nyssa, Augustine, Pseudo-Dionysius and John of Damascus. The answer to this riddle lies in the complex and complicated relationship between Christian philosophy and the social identity of the ecclesia. In many ways, the philosophy Karamanolis is interested in seeks to underpin the communal identity of a religion that at the time had neither a long history nor a clearly identifiable social or national character. This purpose provided for the urgency of intellectual solutions and thus for the originality of many of the ideas and arguments Karamanolis rightly emphasises. It also, however, led to the need to establish political or legal means for enforcing decisions on certain issues that seemed to require fundamental agreement. An attempt to understand the philosophy of early Christianity must not, therefore, juxtapose rational reflection and ecclesiastical decision-making as both are in many ways two sides of the same coin.

Accepting Christian philosophy in late antiquity as idiosyncratic will also help explain the asymmetric character of its relationship with other philosophies. In his conclusion, Karamanolis writes of the 'undeniable' dialogue between Christian and pagan philosophical thinkers (238-9). Yet the word 'dialogue' is somewhat misleading since it is mostly Christian authors who use and respond to pagan thinkers. There is practically no evidence until much later that non-Christian philosophers accept the philosophical credentials of Christian thinkers in the way they accept the credentials of philosophers they disagree with. Some of this arguably reflects the professional contempt of the representatives of time-honoured philosophical traditions towards an upstart movement with questionable ancestry. Yet the utter dismay and incomprehension displayed by the elite of Greek philosophy (from Celsus to Porphyry, Julian and Proclus) towards the intellectual claims of Christianity also speak of their utter bewilderment and bafflement by a thought world that in its entirety appeared to go against much of what everyone else agreed on.

Karamanolis' book is part of a wider trend among historians of ancient philosophy to take Christian thought more seriously as part of the history of philosophy during that period. This trend is altogether to be welcomed. To date it is easily the most comprehensive and most authoritative contribution to this discussion. The fact that it ultimately leads to many further questions should in no way distract from Karamanolis' enormous achievement. All those interested in the intellectual world of late antiquity must be grateful to this erudite and truly philosophical author.