The Philosophy of Epictetus

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Theodore Scaltsas and Andrew S. Mason (eds.), The Philosophy of Epictetus, Oxford University Press, 2007, 181pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199233076.

Reviewed by Brad Inwood, University of Toronto


The philosopher Epictetus began as a slave at Nero's court and became a professional teacher of philosophy in Greece. He is probably the Stoic best known and most influential outside specialist ancient philosophy circles. A.A. Long's Epictetus: A Stoic and Socratic Guide to Life (Oxford 2002) is the most important work on Epictetus in many decades. Yet there is still a great deal to be done, and this collection contributes significantly to that need. These essays are the outcome of a conference held in 2001 (at Larnaca, Cyprus, the modern city on the site of ancient Citium, the home town of Stoicism's founding father, Zeno), and hence they do not uniformly reflect Long's work, although most authors have made some effort to update their essays with references to his book.

The present volume consists of a brief introduction by Andrew Mason, ten relatively short essays on various aspects of Epictetus' philosophy, bibliography and indices. The essays are readily accessible to a non-specialist readership, and throughout the Greek is presented in transliteration. As is often the case with collections based on conferences, the quality of the papers varies, with some offering more genuinely new insight than others, but as a whole it offers a great deal of interesting and important work on a significant figure in ancient philosophy, and Michael Frede's essay demonstrates Epictetus' relevance to ideas of personhood that are of even larger philosophical and historical significance.

As the titles of the essays indicate, the range of the volume is wide:

1.   The Relevance of Moral Theory to Moral Improvement in Epictetus (John M. Cooper)

2.   Epictetus and Logic (Paolo Crivelli)

3.   Epictetus and Stoic Theology (Keimpe Algra)

4.   The Philosopher as God's Messenger (Katerina Ierodiakonou)

5.   Epictetus on Cynicism (Malcolm Schofield)

6.   Epictetus on proairesis and Self (Richard Sorabji)

7.   Death is a Bugbear: Socratic 'Epode' and Epictetus' Philosophy of the Self (Michael Erler)

8.   Epictetus on Freedom: Parallels between Epictetus and Wittgenstein (Myrto Dragona-Monachou)

9.   Epictetus on Moral Perspectives (Julia Annas)

10.  A Notion of a Person in Epictetus (Michael Frede)

Many of the distinctive themes of Epictetus' version of Stoicism are covered in one way or another, though this collection could not claim to be a comprehensive treatment of his thought.

John Cooper opens the volume with an assessment of the theory and practice of moral education in Epictetus, a theme which he has also explored in connection with Seneca and Marcus Aurelius in two recent papers (both included in Knowledge, Nature, and the Good, Princeton 2004). His study of Epictetus takes seriously the apparent fact that the audience for these discourses consisted (though not as exclusively as he claims -- see, for example, Disc. 1.11) of young elite men, even teenagers, deliberating about their future path through life. Cooper argues that the manner of Epictetus' discourses is largely determined by this fact about the original audience. He explores the practical aim of Epictetus' philosophical activity, which did not dispense with the serious mastery of real philosophical argument and doctrine. But at times it seems that this awareness of the practical aim of his work serves primarily to compensate for features of the discourses with which Cooper is impatient. Epictetus' rhetorical manner is at one point dismissed as "his usual ingratiation" (p. 13); Cooper refers to conclusions which Epictetus expresses "over and over again, even ad nauseam" and wishes for a better record of Epictetus' teaching than we in fact have, one which would have enabled us to see

for ourselves how (how on earth, one is tempted to say) Epictetus managed to relate his own peculiarly passive and defeatist Stoicism (nonetheless triumphalist, of course, however hollowly so) to the (in fact) quite different moral outlook of Chrysippus and the other founders (pp. 11-12).

This apparent distaste for Epictetus' distinctive stance is uncharacteristic of the rest of the collection.

Cooper also addresses the issue of where the study of logic fits into Epictetus' system (largely, he thinks, as a tool to defend doctrines learned in earlier stages of training). He situates this in the context of the question of how the traditional Stoic philosophical divisions (logic, physics and ethics) relate to Epictetus' three topoi of study (Disc. 3.2). Paolo Crivelli also takes up this issue and extends it to a general treatment of the role of logic in Epictetus; a lucid and helpful discussion, it does not in substance take us much beyond Jonathan Barnes' Logic and the Imperial Stoa (Leiden 1997).

Richard Sorabji's recent work on the history of the idea of the self (Self, Chicago and Oxford 2006) is reflected in his contribution to this volume, with a special focus on the place of proairesis in relation to Aristotle and earlier Stoicism and an illuminating suggestion about Epictetus' significance for Neoplatonist ideas of epistrophē. The suggestion that Epictetus has more than one idea of proairesis and more than one 'self' in his theory is intriguing but will, I suspect, remain controversial. Sorabji's essay would have been the natural place for a discussion of one theme bafflingly absent from the entire volume, an assessment of Epictetus' distinctive claim that our rational interaction with the world is a matter of how we 'use' our experience (the chrēsis phantasiōn, see 1.6.13, 1.20.15, 1.30.4, 2.5-6, 2.19.32, 2.22.29, 3.22.21/103, 3.24.69, Handbook 6.1.5).

The trio of papers by Keimpe Algra, Katerina Ierodiakonou and Malcolm Schofield demands particular attention because of their close and rewarding interconnections. One of Epictetus' most striking features is his conception of a philosophical vocation, inspired no doubt by the mission of his hero Socrates. This is intimately connected to Epictetus' seemingly distinctive theological stance, an issue which has been the subject of much scholarship and considerable misunderstanding for over a century. Algra argues persuasively that in substance Epictetus remains consistent with the theology of earlier Stoics and that doctrinally he does not veer into a more personal conception of god, as has often been thought. Algra is sensitive to the way Epictetus' personality and temperament shape the way he talks about god, but for an exploration of how this might be developed in detail we turn to Ierodiakonou's detailed study of Epictetus' frequent presentation of the philosopher as a messenger from god, or a witness to truth, someone with a calling or vocation to bring philosophical insight to other human beings. This is clearly part of the reason behind earlier and misguided attempts to compare Epictetus' philosophical commitment to a quasi-Christian religiosity, but Ierodiakonou shows that the key connections are to Socratic and Cynic precedents (though one might add, as she does not, a reference to other religiously tinged portrayals of philosophical heroes, such as Lucretius' treatment of Epicurus as a quasi-divine bringer of salvation in the proem to book 5 of De Rerum Natura). However strange it may seem to us to regard philosophical rigour as part of a god-given mission, Epictetus presents us with just such an image. This rich essay concludes with a sketch of how it happened that philosophy eventually lost its 'divine' warrant when faith and revelation, rather than reason, were successfully institutionalized as the path to salvation. Epictetus' habit (and it is not just his habit alone) of using religious language for philosophical commitment came to look quite different when seen against the background of dogmatic and institutionalized monotheism.

Schofield focuses closely on the role of Cynicism in Epictetus' conception of the mission of philosophy. From the beginning, Cynic philosophers developed in detail the Socratic notion of a divine philosophical vocation, and Cynicism was very much a part of the philosophical and social scene in the early Empire. Epictetus took a strong interest in it, often defining his own mission by comparison with it. Schofield's essay on the topic is an extended exploration of Disc. 3.21.18-19, a passage also discussed by Ierodiakonou (pp. 63-4). To be a philosopher (and so to care properly for young people) involves more than just being wise, according to Epictetus. It is also necessary to be fit for the job in various ways and additionally necessary "that god be advising you to occupy this role, as he advised Socrates to take on the role of cross-examiner, Diogenes [of Sinope] the role of king and critic, and Zeno the role of teacher and formulator of doctrine." Schofield provides not just a compelling view of how Cynicism was meant to work, philosophically, but also a persuasive account of Epictetus' own philosophical and exegetical powers.

Michael Erler and Myrto Dragona-Monachou explore the connections between Epictetus and other philosophers, Plato and Wittgenstein, in essays of very different character. Erler underlines the relationship of Epictetus with the Socrates of Plato's dialogues, above all the Phaedo, from which he takes a metaphor (the "child within") expressing the proper Stoic attitude to the fear of death, in my view correctly focussing on this dialogue as of distinctive importance to Stoicism. Dragona-Monachou reviews Stoic ideas of freedom, by and large embracing the work of Susanne Bobzien (Determinism and Freedom in Stoic Philosophy, Oxford 1988) and with particular attention to Epictetus' Discourse 4.1. The consideration of Wittgenstein's apparent similarities to some facets of Stoicism is suggestive, but Dragona-Monachou refrains from drawing any conclusions about the conscious reception of Epictetus by Wittgenstein.

Julia Annas tackles a central feature of Epictetus' contribution to the tradition of moral deliberation, his sensitivity to the balance between the different perspectives which we need to adopt as moral agents and to the roles or relationships we find ourselves in even before we adopt a more comprehensive view of the obligations we each have as rational beings alongside others in the world. This essay is a rich and detailed development of some themes that have been prominent in Annas' work since The Morality of Happiness (Oxford 1993), and it shares themes with the essays by Cooper and Frede in this volume. Compared to Cooper, Annas is more sympathetic to Epictetus' attention to the embeddedness of his audience in their limited (and limiting) social situations. She acknowledges the value of achieving a theoretical and practical balance between the possibility of changing the world (or indeed of understanding it from an abstract and impersonal standpoint) and the need for each person to achieve happiness in his or her own terms (pp. 149-152). She emphasizes the situation of agents (like most of us) whose position in the world and basic relationships are "unchosen" features of life -- even pointing out that Marcus Aurelius as emperor could be relatively (and sadly) powerless in changing the essential features of the world he lived in and ruled (p. 150). Annas' discussion pursues the question of the prosōpon as well as the relationships or scheseis that each of us has. Frede's exploration of Epictetus' views on prosōpon is more theoretically oriented than Annas' discussion, and they complement each other well.

The volume concludes with an essay by the late Michael Frede. It is an incisive analysis, historical, linguistic and philosophical, of the evolution of the notion of 'person' in antiquity, a development in which Epictetus' use of the term prosōpon plays a very important role. Epictetus' notion of a person is clearly distinct from our modern English uses and even from the refined philosophical use of the term with which we have been familiar since Locke. Frede's patient and precise analysis of several key discourses brings to light a use of the term 'person' which (to be sure) owes much to a Stoic tradition that goes back to Panaetius and even earlier but which also is characteristic of Epictetus' innovative way of analysing moral deliberation and decision. Being the sort of person one is, indeed, being just the individual person one is, and understanding this, is a critical factor in deciding what to do in given circumstances, what to expect of oneself, and what it is right to expect of others. Without sinking into relativism, Epictetus goes beyond any abstract and general concept of personhood of the sort that we often prefer in our metaphysics and in our ethics. Frede's exacting and humane analysis does more than just "shed some light on how we came to think of human beings as persons" (p. 168). It points towards further work on Epictetus, an ancient philosopher of particular importance in the development of philosophy in the modern period; but even more poignantly this essays stands as testimony to the magnitude of the loss we have all suffered through the premature death of its author in the summer of 2007.