The Philosophy of John Norris

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W. J. Mander, The Philosophy of John Norris, Oxford University Press, 2008, 217pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199230303.
Reviewed by: Lawrence Nolan, Marquette University, and June Yang, Grossmont College

Reviewed by Lawrence Nolan, Marquette University, and June Yang, Grossmont College


This book is a comprehensive study of the philosophy of John Norris, one of the most neglected British philosophers of the early modern period. Norris is a minor figure to be sure, but of sufficient importance to merit more attention than he has had. This book is the first of its kind in English in almost thirty years and certainly the most philosophical and sympathetic portrayal in the literature. It is a welcome addition to the recent trend of turning to what Mander calls "rank and file philosophers" as a way of gaining better purchase on the philosophies of such intellectual giants as Descartes, Malebranche, Locke, and Leibniz. In addition to expounding and analyzing Norris' central doctrines and arguments in a masterful way, Mander traces his many influences, which include Plato, Augustine, Descartes, Malebranche, and the Cambridge Platonists. Perhaps more than any other early modern philosopher with the exception of Leibniz, Norris also had a vast knowledge and appreciation of Scholastic thought and a willingness to tap that knowledge for the purposes of solving philosophical problems. Mander does a superb job of illuminating this aspect of his thought. The book also offers rich and detailed discussions of Norris' metaphysics, epistemology, philosophical theology, theory of love, and his controversy with Locke over the nature of ideas, which is similar to the more famous Malebranche-Arnauld debate.

Norris has often been called the "British Malebranche." But the central thesis of Mander's book is that Norris is not simply a disciple of Malebranche but an original philosopher in his own right. Mander, however, stops short of saying that Norris is "a highly innovative philosopher." We are sympathetic with Mander's thesis but think that, even with the important qualification just mentioned, he sometimes overstates his case and, at other times, does not harness all of the resources available to him. He mounts a defense of Norris' originality along several fronts. He argues, for example, that much of what is attributed to Malebranche's influence on Norris is in fact due to the common influence of Descartes, on the one hand, and Plato and Augustine on the other. The trouble with this line of defense is that although it succeeds in showing that Norris is not merely a Malebranche imitator, it does not address (but even encourages) the deeper criticism that his philosophy is derivative and eclectic rather than original and systematic.

To make his case, Mander also notes that Norris rejects, or at least expresses deep reservations about, several aspects of Malebranche's system. The examples he cites include the following. First, whereas Malebranche was an occasionalist about all forms of causation, Norris restricts occasionalism to body-mind causation. Second, whereas Malebranche vehemently denies that the doctrine of vision in God entails vision of God's essence, Norris flirts with this possibility. We think both of these examples are problematic. The problem in the first case is that Norris' willingness to countenance genuine causation at the finite level seems unmotivated. By contrast, Malebranche's occasionalism is motivated by the same central insight as the doctrine of vision in God, namely that created things utterly depend on God in every way. Malebranche saw his philosophy as an attempt to vindicate the scriptural dictum that "In God, we live, move, and have our being" (Acts 17:28). As a theologian, Norris stresses this dictum too but ironically does not appreciate its relevance for occasionalism. Thus, his unwillingness to embrace a thoroughgoing occasionalism makes his philosophy seem less systematic. As for the second case, Antoine Arnauld and others objected that the doctrine of vision in God commits Malebranche to the heretical view that we could have a beatific vision in this life. This is why Malebranche was so concerned to deny that vision in God entails vision of God in his absolute nature. Should we applaud Norris' originality in this instance if it comes at the cost of inviting the twin charges of heresy and mysticism? To be fair, Mander notes that Norris qualifies the claim that we see God's essence and, perhaps as a result, was never accused of unorthodoxy. (It is also worth noting that unlike the Catholic Malebranche, Norris was an Anglican and thus not subject to the same standard of heresy). Nevertheless, with respect to these two examples at least, it seems to us that Norris' philosophy suffers to the degree that it diverges from that of Malebranche. Originality sometimes comes at a price.

Fortunately, Mander has a more promising line of defense, which consists in showing how Norris goes beyond Malebranche in various ways -- in terms of arguments, doctrines, and philosophical motivations. As mentioned above, Norris is more willing than other early modern thinkers to tap the resources of Scholastic thought to solve philosophical problems, showing that he is deeply wedded to the university tradition. Mander does an excellent job of highlighting this and specifically invokes the medieval theory of distinctions as an example of one of these resources. We would like to mention two applications of this theory that could have helped Mander's case. First, Norris uses the theory to make sense of the Christian doctrine of divine simplicity. It is difficult to reconcile this doctrine with belief in the Trinity and the claim that God has multiple attributes. For Malebranche and Norris, the problem is exacerbated by their view that there are multiple ideas and eternal truths in God. Mander returns time and again to puzzles directly or indirectly related to the issue of divine simplicity. For example, Mander finds Norris' identity of the intellectual and divine world, or truth and God, troublesome (47). The reconciliation of apparent complexity (i.e. divine ideas, eternal truths, attributes, the understanding and will and so on) with simplicity has been discussed extensively in the Malebranche literature. But unlike Malebranche, who has no truck with the theory of distinctions, Norris considered a coherent account of God to be of the utmost importance (IW I 293-4); so he devotes several passages to explaining and applying the Scholastic notion of a rational distinction to solve the problem. Norris believes that although ideas, attributes, and truths have the appearance of introducing complexity in God, they are just different ways of conceiving God (see e.g., Postscript IW I; IW I 406-407; Reason 33-4).

Second, Norris enlists the theory of distinctions to defend Cartesian dualism against Locke's thinking matter hypothesis. Here, his discussion of the difference between complete and incomplete conceptions, which figures in his account of the real and rational distinctions, comes to the fore. Norris' defense of Descartes' real distinction proof is some of the best philosophical argumentation in his corpus. He is greatly concerned to defend the twin doctrines of the immortality and immateriality of the soul against materialism. So he uses the theory of distinctions to show that Locke's thinking matter hypothesis is unintelligible. It is a formidable tool for him and one the reader sees him applying throughout his philosophical works. It is important to note, however, that Norris sees himself not as defending his own version of the proof, which shares in the same difficulties as Malebranche's (see below), but as rehearsing Descartes' proof. Again, it would have significantly assisted Mander's case if he had included a discussion of this important issue. In these two instances, among others, we believe Norris did improve upon the thought of Malebranche.

Some of Norris' most important divergences from Malebranche are due to an even stronger commitment than his French counterpart to Neoplatonism or, more specifically, to Augustinianism. Mander discusses at least two examples of this. The first concerns Norris' reservations about applying the doctrine of vision in God (which, as Mander notes, Norris claims to have discovered independently of Malebranche) to sense perception. Augustine's doctrine of divine illumination was limited to the cognition of abstract truths. Malebranche saw himself as extending this doctrine to sense perception, but there are various problems in doing so, including whether this commits him to particular ideas in God that are changeable and thus threatens divine immutability. Another important innovation of Norris' philosophy over Malebranche's lies in the fact that he has a much richer account of exemplary causation. Contemporary philosophers might recoil at the suggestion that this constitutes an innovation, but Platonists generally seem to be committed to it. This applies to Malebranche too but, unfortunately, he says precious little about it. By contrast, Norris discusses it explicitly, at some length, and, as Mander notes, shows how it goes hand in hand with efficient causation.

There are other places in Norris' philosophy where one wishes that he had improved upon Malebranche's thought but, unfortunately, does not. One of the most important of these places concerns knowledge of the soul. Malebranche and Norris agree that although we have a clear idea of body as extension, we lack a clear idea of the mind or, to put it more precisely, we lack access to the idea of the mind that is contained in the divine understanding and must be so contained to serve as the archetype for creation. Since this idea is barred to us, we lack knowledge of the mind's essence. In denying us this knowledge, Malebranche and Norris are of course deviating from Descartes. But doing so poses a problem, for they want to argue for Cartesian dualism at the very same time that they are robbing themselves of one of the resources needed to produce such an argument. In his own version of the proof of the real distinction between mind and body, Descartes appeals to the fact that we have clear and distinct ideas of both and can exclude one from the other in our thought. Absent a clear idea of the mind, the most that Malebranche and Norris can hope for is to mount a negative argument showing that body is not a thinking thing. But if thought is only one of the properties (or "acts") of the mind and not its essential attribute, as they both maintain, then this does nothing to prove that mind and body are really distinct. Although we see the absence of a clear idea of soul as an insurmountable hurdle, Mander notes that Norris marshals two original arguments for disembodied mentality. The arguments in question are very interesting but in our opinion do not succeed in achieving the desired result. In one of these, Norris argues that since no necessary being could depend on something contingent such as matter, we can conceive of the intelligible world existing even if there were no material world. Mander draws some fascinating conclusions about the nature of intelligibility and the idealist flavor of Norris' thought from this argument. But, unfortunately, all the argument shows is that the intelligible world that constitutes God's understanding is independent from the material world. It does not show that finite minds are really distinct from body and thus does nothing to secure Norris' dualism. Norris may do more than Malebranche in trying to establish the latter but, since his efforts fail, it is difficult to say that he surpasses him on this score.

There is at least one other instance where Mander claims that Norris outdoes his French counterpart but in fact does not. This instance is more troubling than the last because it involves an important oversight on Mander's part. In The Search After Truth, when arguing for the doctrine of vision in God, Malebranche outlines five possible sources of ideas and then proceeds to eliminate all but the one he prefers, namely, that ideas are in God. One of the sources that he wishes to eliminate is Cartesian nativism, which holds that ideas of the material world are implanted innately within us. Mander asserts that, in an effort to eliminate it, Norris "strikes out on his own" by appealing to the fact that ideas are necessary, eternal, and immutable (80). Given these properties, ideas cannot be created by God and thus cannot be part of our native endowment. But, as it turns out, this argument is not original to Norris. Malebranche first uses this "argument from properties," as it is sometimes called in the secondary literature, in Elucidation 10, appended to the third edition of the Search (1678), and then again in the Dialogues on Metaphysics (1688). The only difference is that rather than using it as a negative argument to eliminate Cartesian nativism as a possible competitor to his own view, Malebranche uses it as an independent positive argument for the conclusion that ideas are in God. If anything, Norris' use of the argument is regressive for it figures in the argument from elimination that commentators have found problematic in Malebranche's philosophy and that Malebranche himself ultimately abandons in favor of positive arguments.

One of the strengths of Mander's book lies in its adept analysis of Norris' various doctrines and in Mander's ability to raise potential problems with them. Here we cite just one notable example. Norris' philosophy, and Cartesianism more generally, threatens to collapse into Spinozism or at least some form of pantheism. This is well known, but Mander shows how this threat manifests itself in a previously unexplored quarter. For both Norris and Malebranche, ideas in God constitute the essences of finite things. But Mander rightly wonders how the essences of created things can be completely outside of them. If the essences of creatures are in God, must not the creatures themselves be in God? This is a clever way of setting up the problem. It is notable that Descartes is able to avoid this version of the problem because he maintains that the essence and existence of a thing are merely rationally (or conceptually) distinct. In placing ideas (and hence essences) in God, Malebranche and Norris are reverting to the Thomistic tradition, which holds that there is a real distinction between essence and existence in finite things. But this distinction is the source of the problem. Here we wonder, though, whether Norris' distinction between two types of essences, which Mander discusses in another context, might be enlisted to provide a solution. For every finite thing that exists there is the "representative" or "intelligible" essence in God and the "constitutive" essence in the world. Only the latter includes existence or, more precisely, is merely rationally distinct from the existing thing. Mander notes that Norris' doctrine of two types of essences is an attempt to reconcile the Thomistic theory of real distinction between essence and existence and the Suarezian theory of rational distinction. Once again, Norris is able to improve upon an aspect of Malebranche's philosophy by appealing to the traditional theory of distinctions and by tapping his broad knowledge of Scholasticism.

What makes Mander's book an important read, even for those who may not initially be interested in Norris, is that it makes a compelling argument for studying minor figures generally. Norris is presented as a case study. Earlier we noted that even if Norris' thought is original in many ways, his philosophy is not as systematic as one might like. But Mander rightly sees this relative lack of systematicity as an attraction for those interested in understanding 17th-century intellectual currents, for which Norris' philosophy serves as a mirror. "[T]he general tendencies of an age may often be seen more clearly in its writers of the second rather than of the first rank" (200). He argues that one reason that Norris' "real life philosophy" is unsystematic is that he was moved by the different points of view and intellectual tensions present in the 17th-century. To understand Norris' philosophy is to understand these tensions and cross-currents.