The Philosophy of Literature

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Peter Lamarque, The Philosophy of Literature, Blackwell, 2009, 329pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405121989.

Reviewed by Robert J. Yanal, Wayne State University


The Philosophy of Literature is another installment in the Foundations of the Philosophy of the Arts series, which "is designed to provide a comprehensive but flexible series of concise texts addressing both fundamental general questions about art as well as questions about the several arts". Peter Lamarque, formerly editor of the British Journal of Aesthetics, has made a specialty of the philosophy of literature, having authored two books in this area (with Stein Haugom Olsen Truth, Fiction and Literature (1994), and Fictional Points of View (1996)), along with a goodly number of articles. I shall not here describe points of similarity with or departure from Lamarque's previous work. Appropriately for a book that presents itself as an introduction to the field, Lamarque gives a historical overview of various sub-topics in the philosophy of literature as well as supplementary readings for each chapter.

The topics canvassed are: literature-as-art; the role of the author (including attention to the intentional "fallacy"), reading a work of art-literature (including issues regarding interpretation), issues raised by works of fiction (including the ontology of fictional characters and emotions towards fiction), literary truth (what it might be); and the evaluation of literature (including the formation of a "canon" and "ethical criticism"). There are many topics I haven't listed (hence "including"), and certainly many topics I cannot touch on in this review. Indeed, I shall focus on one topic here: the definition of literature (which does seem to be Lamarque's principal concern).

His Preface begins, "What exactly is it to view literature as art?" (vii), implying that the book is an exploration of various issues that arise from this very question. There is one general objection I have to this, though it isn't terribly serious. Some issues touched on in the book do directly relate to the problem of defining art-literature. If a text is art-literature, we might adopt approaches to it that are like those we would take towards other art forms (e.g., attention to form and structure, special ways of evaluation). But other issues can be raised quite independently of whether a text is art-literature: interpretation, the ontology of fiction, and emotion towards fiction, to name three. The same issues that arise with the interpretation of art-literature come up with the interpretation of non-art texts, such as legal contracts. That is, the fact that a certain text is a work of art is not always what forces issues of interpretation. Too, "Not all novels … are 'literary' " (31), but even fictional stories that are not art-literature raise issues of ontology and emotional reaction. (What, if anything, does "Sherlock Holmes" refer to? What is the nature of our emotional response to reading "The Adventure of the Speckled Band"?)

Literary theorists -- New Critics, Structuralists, etc. -- are not interested in the problem of when a text is a work of literary art (though something like it arises as the problem of canon formation). Philosophers, though, are interested in definition, and the standard form of the analytical problematic is to seek necessary and sufficient conditions for "X is a work of literary art". Lamarque places restrictions on what counts as an acceptable definition: it would be one that provides "a coherent, central, and defensible place for aesthetic pleasure, for aesthetic features distinct from merely textual features, for a sui generis mode of aesthetic appreciation, and for some conception of aesthetic value" (26). (What follows this brief quotation is a much longer list, including the demands that a definition encompass all literary forms -- poetry, novel, etc. -- without giving priority to one over the other, recognize the autonomy of literary practice "with its own traditions and conventions", and not reduce the "complex nature of literary response" to one aspect, such as poetic imagery.)

Art-literature -- this is my term -- cannot be defined as "fine writing," for much that Lamarque calls "generic literature" -- i.e., texts that are not art-literature (diaries, essays, etc.) -- exhibit fine writing, and some art-literature (e.g., Philip Larkin's "This Be the Verse") might be "directly" written but does not "exemplify fine writing as that is normally understood" (30): "They fuck you up, your mum and dad. / They may not mean to, but they do." The "mimetic" conception of art-literature, advanced in many forms beginning with Plato and Aristotle, is the idea that to be art-literature a text must "mirror" reality (a term used by both Plato and Samuel Johnson). Lamarque's argument against such theories is that they "promote those forms, like epic, narrative, and drama, where character, action, or plot are highlighted" (46). Apparently Lamarque thinks that a mimetic definition would violate one of his strictures on an acceptable definition of art-literature: it would give "priority" to one literary form over another. But giving "priority" to some forms of literature is not the same as excluding others. True, one may think first of the realist novel as the prime example of literary mimetic art, but this doesn't mean that the short lyric poem (say) is not also mimetic.

Lamarque's principal argument against mimetic (and other) definitions is to advance his own intuitions. "Part of what is involved in appreciating a work of art as a work of art is to appreciate it as an artifact designed for a purpose" (136). What purpose(s)? To induce "[1] a heightened awareness of form and structure and the 'design' of the whole; [2] an expectation of coherence and inner connectedness; [3] an expectation that the work presents a subject of some interest, either through narrative content, imagined emotion, or metaphoric illustration; [4] an expectation that the work exhibits and develops organizing principles or themes that provide unity and value in the work beyond the immediacy of the subject, inviting reflection on matters of more universal human concern" (137). It is unclear whether Lamarque intends these to be individually necessary and jointly sufficient for being art-literature (i.e. to be a definition), but I'll take them to be such (and the numbering -- [1], [2], … -- is also mine). Art-literature, then, is writing (or a text) that has as its purposes [1] through [4].

The argument for this definition is unexpressed, but it would seem to be the following. There is a list of "musts" that any definition of art-literature must satisfy (26). Presumably, these musts are expressions of Lamarque's intuitions about art-literature. Then [1] through [4] are advanced as defining conditions that meet the musts. Ultimately, then, Lamarque's definition is supported by his intuitions about art-literature. I don't object to using intuition in a crucial way to solve philosophical problems. But for one set of intuitions there is often another set that runs counter to the first (e.g., someone says that her intuitions don't require art-literature to "invite reflection on matters of universal human concern"). I will pass over the problem of how we know what purposes a text was designed to serve. But I will note that a text held to these purposes must have certain values; and that Lamarque's definition of art-literature is what is termed an evaluative definition of art.

The argument against mimetic (and other) definitions is that they would allow as art-literature much that isn't advanced for one or the other of these purposes. The Sherlock Holmes stories, entertaining as they might be, do not seek to induce a heightened awareness of form and structure, nor do they invite reflection on matters of more universal human concern. Well, I say this, but the conditions are somewhat vague. Clearly, King Lear and In Search of Lost Time meet them. Does du Maurier's Rebecca? Brontë's Jane Eyre? Isherwood's Berlin Stories?

Lamarque rehearses readings of Shakespeare's Sonnet 4 and of Spenser's poem, "Epithalamion". In Sonnet 4, a critic traces the "imagery of financial matters" throughout the poem (139), noting among other features the poet's repetitions of "abuse," "usurer," "use," and "unus'd". And we're told that "Epithalamion", a poem in which a wedding day is celebrated and commemorated, has 24 stanzas (hours of the day), in which 16 have a 'positive' refrain (hours of light in southern Ireland on the day of the marriage) and 8 a 'negative' refrain (hours of dark); and to top it off, the poem contains 365 long lines (days of the year) (138). These are examples where "form and structure" and "coherence and inner connectedness" are delivered in spades. Still, not all aspirants to art-literature need meet such high standards. One might, for example, point out the disconnectedness of the incidents in Isherwood's stories as exemplifying the uncertainties in the author's own motives and plans. Or the arc of the story in Rebecca, which begins with the unnamed heroine's role as helpmate to her near-feckless husband, and thus prefigures her gradual realization through the story that this will be her role in her marriage. Is this enough to satisfy conditions [1] or [2]?

To further investigate conditions [3] and [4], we enter into two related problems: interpretation and truth in literature. Interpretation is an investigation into what a work is about, not at the "subject level" (what a brief summary of the work would tell us), but at the "thematic level." Jane Austin's Emma "is really about marriage as an ordeal" (151, according to critic Ronald Blythe). Art-literature "invites" an interest in thematic aboutness; with "genre fiction … readers have little inclination to seek out underlying themes of this general nature" (150). I must for reasons of space pass over Lamarque's discussion of the various problems surrounding the theme(s) of a work: Are these themes "recovered" or "imposed"? What is the role of the author's intentions? Can incompatible themes -- A Christmas Carol is about the corrosive effects of capitalism; A Christmas Carol is about the salvific effect of Christian love -- be both correct? Is there even a sense in which any thematic interpretation is correct or incorrect?

I do, however, want to raise one objection as it relates to Lamarque's definition of art-literature. Suppose a reader did seek out a theme in what is ostensibly a work of genre fiction: Stephen King's The Shining is (like Emma) about marriage as an ordeal. Lamarque might respond that King didn't "invite" such an interest, but how does he know? And suppose this reader took up the interpretive project uninvited. Would this be enough to show that The Shining meets condition [3]?

What about the truth of themes? Lamarque here takes what I regard as the correct position.

Martha Nussbaum characterizes a theme of Euripides's Hecuba as 'nothing human is ever worthy of trust …' As a thematic statement this captures well an implicit motif in this dark and troubling play. But as a generalization about human nature its truth is highly dubious … Does this affect the value or interest of the play? No, we simply note that the play offers a dark and pessimistic vision … It also shows that worldly truth is not always relevant to literary value. (237)

Then there is the problem of "banality." The critic J. Hillis Miller finds in Dickens's Our Mutual Friend a theme of the "power of money." Lamarque comments: "But if we try to extract a worldly truth from all this … such as 'Money corrupts,' we are back to banality" (239).

Lamarque, inconsistently I think, says, "There is no denying the fact of the matter that readers do learn all kinds of things from novels and poems," though he considers it a "mistake … to suppose that to be serious or reflective a work must in effect teach something" (253). But is it a "fact" that readers learn things from novels and poems? I say that X learns that p through activity A if and only if A gives X grounds for knowledge (or, at least, the justified belief) that p. But reading a novel or poem does not in itself provide grounds for either knowledge or justified belief, and this because fictional (or imaginary) situations do not provide real data.

The Philosophy of Literature definitely meets one standard set by the series in which it is set. It is a "comprehensive" work. I, for one, can't think of a topic from the philosophy of literature omitted. I'm hard pressed to say whether it is "flexible."