The Philosophy of Mary Astell: An Early Modern Theory of Virtue

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Jacqueline Broad, The Philosophy of Mary Astell: An Early Modern Theory of Virtue, Oxford University Press, 2015, 205pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198716815.

Reviewed by Penny Weiss, St. Louis University


It is hard to believe that it was only in 1986 that the first two modern books on Mary Astell were published, one a biography, the other a collection of complete and excerpted works. In the 30 years since, all of Astell's major writings have been made available, several with substantive introductions, and three monographs, an anthology of critical essays, and dozens of academic articles from multiple disciplines have been published. We can now add to the growing list this book by Jacqueline Broad, who has mastered and engages with all of this primary and secondary literature. Broad is the first to read Astell's texts as parts of "a united and consistent" (5) philosophical system with a moral theory at its core, which she importantly claims is how Astell understood her own work. Broad's unmistakable grasp of Astell does not always manifest itself evenly; one chapter tackles a particular work while another deals with a theme and yet another makes central a conflict in the secondary literature. Further, one chapter is overwhelmed by comparisons with those who influenced Astell, in another they rarely appear, and in none but the conclusion are contemporary links pursued, though they practically beg to be explored. Nonetheless, everyone will learn from this text, several debates about Astell are resolved in it, and Astell's philosophical status is generally elevated.

Broad's primary goal is to provide an "accessible account of Astell's philosophical ideas and arguments" (3); her strategies for accomplishing this include providing "the historical-intellectual context" of her ideas, and first reading the parts (epistemology, theology, etc.) separately and then gradually weaving them back together. These strategies do not easily lend themselves to the clarity and accessibility Broad desires. Nor does Broad completely succeed in treating the threads as equally independent wholes, as some end up seeming to serve others. She is utterly persuasive, however, in bringing clarity of purpose to Astell's work through emphasis on its ethical dimension, making this a novel and valuable contribution to Astell scholarship. Further, she clarifies the nature of that moral center. Only when academic discourse has reached a certain point can one wrestle with both original and secondary sources and convincingly defend the claim that "all the different aspects of Astell's philosophical thought, ranging from her epistemology and theology to her metaphysics, ethics, and politics . . . come together as a unified whole" (v).

The introductory chapter asks us to consider Astell as an early modern philosopher who, like her "great" male counterparts (Locke, Leibniz, etc.), "asked questions concerning the foundations of knowledge, the existence of God, the nature of soul and body, and our duties and obligations as moral and political subjects"; very unlike those "greats," however, Astell "was preoccupied with the concerns of women" and "developed a moral theory designed to help the female sex attain lasting wisdom, virtue, and happiness" (1). Broad introduces Astell's two general types of female characters, who will pop up throughout the book: the weak, dependent, anxious, female "that seventeenth-century custom encourages women to cultivate" (3), and the moral female with "mental fortitude" who "lives her life in accordance with reason" (2), which any woman can become. We get some preliminary notes about influences on Astell, about which we will hear (too) much more, and about some whom she influenced, which is unfortunately not a continuing theme. One ends this chapter eager to learn how "Astell 'the metaphysician and philosopher' and Astell 'the feminist projector and crusader'" are "one and the same" (23).

The upshot of the chapter on knowledge is clear: Astell's emphasis is on practical knowledge; habituation to folly and submission to the authority of men are the obstacles on women's path to knowledge; and what women need are certain "habits of mind or the necessary mental dispositions to attain virtue and knowledge" (26), including, for example, attentiveness. Interestingly, "purity of mind" plays a central role -- "withdrawal from the senses, the regulation of the passions, and disengagement from the love of material things" (28). There are too many comparisons with an almost dizzying list of male philosophers that accomplish little more than to check off who she is like and unlike on every point, and not enough connections to contemporary debates, which Broad had promised (10). For example, what would feminist epistemologists say about Astell's emphasis on ordered thinking and one productive thought process? But Broad supports her main thesis by showing links between Astell's epistemology and her moral theory.

In the chapter on theology the reader again is left with two discomfiting feelings: that this is not Broad's real strength or interest, and that Astell is drowning in comparisons and not being allowed to set her own stage. Broad's explanation may be that, as with epistemology, Astell, too, does not find here her main strength and interest (45), but instead uses them to support her ethical theory. As a moral philosopher, what is necessary for Astell is that we have duties to God. She spends more time, then, on the positive consequences of living in accordance with divine law than, for example, on proving God's existence. Surprisingly, "the bringing of her female readers to the explicit recognition that God is infinitely wise and perfectly benevolent has a specific, consciousness-raising purpose in Astell's work" (45), as they will learn to live in accordance with reason.

"Soul and Body" has two especially strong points that fulfill Broad's overall goals. She links ideas about the nature of the soul to ethics -- "We must pursue what is conducive to our happiness and perfection as immaterial and immortal beings" (71); and she shows what the distinct take-away is for women -- "knowledge of the true nature of the self can liberate women from thinking and living as if they were mere bodily creatures" and thus prompt self-improvement (71). Astell "always affirms a woman's ability to use her free will to raise herself up, to direct her mind's attention to the best things, and to acquire a certain 'greatness of soul' through her voluntary efforts" (83). The endless comparisons with the big boys eventually lead the reader to wonder to what extent they and their categories and distinctions, vs. Astell and hers, are framing the discussion, and to wish for more on Astell's view of such things as self-love and tranquility of mind and less on whether she is "a consistent Cartesian interactionist" (64) and/or "Malebranchean occasionalist" (73).

Finally Broad turns from "the foundations of Astell's philosophy . . . to the heart of that theory itself" (83). In Chapter 5, "Virtue and the Passions," Broad soars. She shows that Astell treats women "as embodied subjects -- as a substantial union of soul and body -- and not just disembodied minds" (84). Astell's very reasonable position on the passions is that "the virtuous person is not dispassionate or unfeeling . . . Rather, she has a disposition to feel the right way in proportion to the circumstances and toward those ends or objects that are truly worthy of her concern" (88). Purity of mind becomes relevant again. We "purify our passions by placing them upon their proper objects" (93). For Astell, "To perform a virtuous action, we must perform it with the right intentions, for the right reason, and with the proper end in mind" (93); thus do passions become virtues (94). As might be surmised, this approach amounts to a defense "of the art of prudence" (94). Broad next considers generosity, a term that means not liberality but greatness of soul, a disposition akin to "generosity of spirit" (96). Astell makes generosity a universal passion and it informs most of her works, since "the concepts of self esteem and 'living up to the dignity of one's nature' are central preoccupations" (98). Women's traditional training corrupts generosity by having women's self-esteem rest on all the wrong things. But generosity can be "a tool in the service of female emancipation from custom" (99) because it helps women brave public opinion and place their esteem on internal accomplishments that are in their control. Broad always does a nice job of interpreting a piece or idea in terms of its lessons for women. Astell repeatedly returns to how change is possible. Again, a contemporary question might suggest itself to the reader: have not "humility and modesty" been traditional female virtues? Are they not as compatible with the weak women Astell condemns as with the reasonable one who has attained equanimity? If so, is this emphasis on personal change and empowerment, at least in the absence of equal emphasis on dramatic social change, a dangerous strategy to rely upon?

Chapter 6 is on love, the "passion [that] occupies the most exalted place in Astell's moral philosophy" (106). The first part of the chapter turns to comparing (again) Astell with John Norris and Augustine on love of God. Broad's treatment of benevolence is stronger, more Astell-centered. She sets out to answer whether "Astell's emphasis upon an exclusive love of God makes [her philosophy] . . . seem both practically impossible and morally undesirable" (109). Broad answers this by exploring a distinction between a love of desire for God and a love of benevolence, or goodwill, that is for other people (110). She resuscitates a humane conception and practice of love of God, one that teaches us to love other people with that generosity of spirit explored earlier. Friendship takes on a narrow role in this chapter, a virtue of "having the right kind of loving disposition toward another person" (119), limited to a very few but still "a useful tool in the moral reformation of early modern women" (119). Love of benevolence, on the other hand, becomes a great social virtue that teaches us to see the connectedness of all and thus desire, for example, the education of women (123). Astell and Broad are convinced that desiring God and learning genuine benevolence to all are both practical and desirable goals beneficial to women.

The chapter on marriage offers a basic reading of Astell's famous work, Some Reflections Upon Marriage. What makes it valuable is the way earlier threads of the book come together into the work's "moral message" (130). Previous discussions on love, friendship, virtue, and passions are all relevant, supporting Broad's main thesis of a moral core to Astell's philosophical whole. It is curious in a way that this is the first time the systematic oppression of women really gets attention (134). Had this come up earlier, it might have affected the contents of other chapters for the better, directing them to address systems of domination rather than, say, unequal educational opportunities or being weak-willed. But Broad succeeds admirably in showing how patriarchal marriage violates every Astellian principle and priority:

Astell's basic moral message is that the domineering behaviour of early modern men toward their wives is intrinsically wrong because they do not treat women as free and rational creatures, or accord them the dignity and respect that is due to all human beings. . . Their behaviour is also instrumentally wrong because it leads to women cultivating a slavish, servile disposition of character in which they come to ignore the law of reason, and act in terms of worldly self-interest rather than generosity or benevolence (137).

Broad also reads Reflections as a tract against tyranny, in the Lockean sense, though she does not clarify why only Astell critiques domestic as well as political tyranny. This seems a lost opportunity, and a more important matter than the extent to which she is ironically criticizing Whig thought (143), and the treatment of passive obedience is unenlightened. She could say more about how the change in women's character that Astell recommends relates to social change, rather than only to the prevention of tyranny in marriage. And once we fail to prevent tyranny, must we really give up resisting?

The penultimate chapter is an interesting exploration of Astell's three pamphlets against occasional conformity, which Broad reads as part of Astell's theory of virtue, as consistent with her feminist critique of tyranny, (151) and even as containing lessons for "the kinds of disposition politically-involved women ought to cultivate" (152). Astell sees the occasional conformist as someone with a tyrannical disposition, "clearly motivated by unregulated passions, such as vanity, avarice, ambition, revenge, and envy" (157) and hungry for power. Based on a reading of historical events, Astell shows them to be dangers to the political community, uninterested in the public good. Broad again reads Astell as less comfortable with "a decisive politics of action" in response to tyranny (160) than do several others, myself included. Perhaps the problem with a book devoted to showing the consistency of an author's thought is the way that goal knocks other ends out of the conversation. In this chapter, for example, Broad successfully shows that Astell's "political pamphlets are thus perfectly consistent with her recommendations in her earlier feminist works" (166), but she does not get to the strengths and weaknesses and contemporary relevance of that consistent position.

In the conclusion, Broad reminds us that Astell's "primary goal [is] to help the female sex attain lasting happiness" (167): to "bring about a moral awakening in the lives of women" (95), to help "women to cultivate a certain strength of character" (145), and to provide them "with guidance on how to live a good and virtuous life" (v). She uses the chapter "to explore the implications of writing [Astell] back in" the "annals of philosophy" (169). She finally turns to "the implications of her thought for philosophy as we conceive it today" (169). Many contemporary feminist theorists debate the merits of writing women, or a particular woman, into the canon. Philosophers, members of that overwhelmingly white male discipline, seem particularly interested in labeling historical women "philosophers," as if there is in that naming something that will bring the discipline around to reading them seriously. We learn in the end that Astell can be linked with contemporary work in feminist ethics. I am sorry that we had to wait until page 170 to encounter Astell's "feminist theory of freedom," a few pages from the end where nothing should really "come as something of a surprise."

Broad rightly and judiciously offers "a charitable interpretation on Astell's remarks" throughout (95), a generosity of interpretative spirit common to good exegetical analysis and in accord with Astell's understanding of the nature and importance of generosity. I cannot but help thinking that Broad cut herself off a bit short in this book. She has such a grasp of Astell, of the secondary literature about her, and of her contemporaries, that she could have wandered into some more probing territory, though I get that such was not her mission. While I yearned a little for more of the sarcastic, powerfully logical, passionate Astell that I know to come through, what is here is undoubtedly sound, careful, and learned.