The Philosophy of Recognition: Historical and Contemporary Perspectives

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Hans-Christoph Schmidt am Busch and Christopher F. Zurn (eds.), The Philosophy of Recognition: Historical and Contemporary Perspectives, Lexington Books, 2010, 378pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739144251.

Reviewed by Amy Allen, Dartmouth College


Over the last two decades, the concept of recognition has become central to debates within two distinct intellectual contexts: contemporary social and political philosophy, on the one hand, and history of philosophy, of German Idealism in particular, on the other. The goal of The Philosophy of Recognition: Historical and Contemporary Perspectives is, as the subtitle suggests, to bring together essays by scholars working both within and across these two areas of recognition theory. As Christopher Zurn explains in his insightful and substantial introduction to the volume, the editors organized the book in this way because they

are convinced that progress in the philosophy of recognition will only be made through careful attention to the insights available from the past combined with scrupulous attention to both the specific character of contemporary debates in moral, social, and political philosophy and contemporary moral, social, and political life itself (1).

Given this aim, it is not surprising that Axel Honneth’s work is at the heart of this volume. For, more than any other contemporary recognition theorist, Honneth has developed his theory in conversation with both historians of philosophy — in particular, Hegel scholars — and contemporary social and political theorists — in particular, critical social theorists. Like Honneth, Zurn aligns the project of recognition theory with that of critical theory, claiming that the former can be understood as “a systematic constellation of moral theory, social theory, and political analysis” which “reanimates the tradition of a critical diagnosis of the social pathologies of the present” (11). In light of this collection’s focus on the relationship between recognition and critical theory, in general, and on Honneth’s work, in particular, it should be of great interest not only to anyone interested in the concept of recognition, but also to all those interested in the current direction of critical theory.

In addition to Zurn’s introduction, the volume contains fourteen essays, seven of which have more of a historical focus and seven of which have more of a contemporary focus, though several of the essays do, indeed, bridge that divide in interesting ways. The editors chose not to divide the volume up into distinct sections, perhaps as a way of avoiding the temptation to introduce potentially misleading or invidious distinctions between historical and contemporary approaches to the topic. And yet that decision has the side effect of leaving the thematic connections between the essays and the organizational structure of the volume as a whole for the reader to discern for herself. Zurn’s introduction explains with admirable clarity the historical and intellectual context for contemporary recognition theory, argues convincingly for the importance of the concept of recognition given the state of current debates in moral, social, and political philosophy and provides incisive synopses of each of the individual essays.

Although Hegel is the historical figure most closely associated with recognition theory, the first two essays in the volume explore the pre-Hegelian roots of the concept of recognition in interesting ways. Frederick Neuhouser’s "Rousseau and the Human Drive for Recognition (Amour Propre)" offers a fascinating and compelling account of Rousseau as “the first thinker in the history of philosophy to place the striving for recognition from others at the very core of human nature” (21). The essay carefully and precisely lays out Rousseau’s understanding of amour propre as an inherently social (and therefore malleable) but also necessary (and therefore ferociously held) passion that manifests itself as a “need to be esteemed, admired, or thought valuable (in some respect)” (22). The most interesting feature of Neuhouser’s essay is his clear articulation of the ambivalent nature of amour propre for Rousseau. Rousseau regards amour propre as both the principal source of human ills and evils — the intensity and intractability of human conflict is a function of the ferocity of the passion for amour propreand the solution for those ills and evils — amour propre is a condition of possibility for the free, rational, moral agency that can allow us to ameliorate and overcome such conflicts. For Rousseau, as Neuhouser shows us, the drive for recognition is both poison and cure. This insight could prove extremely fruitful for discussion of recognition within contemporary social and political theory, were it to be brought to bear on those discussions in a systematic way.

The same could be said of the tension that structures J.M. Bernstein’s discussion of Fichte in his essay “Recognition and Embodiment: Fichte’s Materialism”: namely, the tension between the idealistic (in the sense of mind-dependent) nature of the notion of recognition and the embodied materiality of all those who are subjects of recognition. By bringing these two dimensions of recognition together in a systematic and integrative way, Fichte, on Bernstein’s reading, seeks to “materialize idealism” by showing that “self-consciousness is … just as much interbodily as intersubjectively constituted” (49). Bernstein’s interpretive argument for this claim is too nuanced and complex to do justice to here; suffice it to say that his interpretation of Fichte productively challenges readers to rethink traditionally accepted philosophical dichotomies between ideal and real, transcendental and empirical, norm and fact. Although he laments the fact that Fichte did not correctly draw out the implications of his own account of recognition, Bernstein nonetheless credits Fichte with giving “a radical materialist twist” to “self-determination and normativity” (81). By drawing attention to the embodied materiality of subjects and processes of recognition, Bernstein opens up interesting and potentially ground-breaking connections between recognition theory and phenomenology that theorists of recognition would do well to pursue further.

The next three essays in the collection explore different aspects of Hegel’s notion of recognition. Michael Quante’s "’The Pure Notion of Recognition’: Reflections on the Grammar of the Relation of Recognition in Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit," focuses on the ontological, rather than the ethical, relationship between recognition and spirit in Hegel’s locus classicus. This focus enables Quante to maintain that Hegel’s insights into the constitutively social dimensions of self-consciousness and human action can be defended against charges of “totalitarianism” and can be seen to anticipate in interesting ways work on collective intentionality in contemporary analytic philosophy. Ludwig Siep’s "Recognition in Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit and Contemporary Practical Philosophy," takes the opposite tack, focusing on the practical-philosophical (rather than ontological) aspects and implications of Hegel’s account of recognition in the Phenomenology. After systematically drawing out connections between Hegel’s account of recognition in the Phenomenology and the use to which the concept of recognition is put in contemporary practical philosophy, Siep expresses skepticism about whether recognition theory can serve as a basic framework for all work in practical philosophy. In light of the contemporary salience of the relationship between human beings and nonhuman nature for many different issues in practical philosophy — from the ethics of human enhancement and cloning to the ethical challenges posed by climate change and population growth — Siep argues that we are in need of an ethical conception of a “well-ordered world” (124), and that such a conception cannot be derived from the concept of recognition.

In the third essay, “Recognition, the Right, and the Good,” Terry Pinkard takes the relationship between Hegel’s account of recognition and that found in contemporary practical philosophy in a different direction than Siep. By elucidating Hegel’s insight that recognition is constitutive of human agency, and, as such, brings together both the right and the good, Pinkard endeavors to show “what a more Hegelian model of recognition might contribute to a contemporary form of critical theory” (132). The core of this contribution is Pinkard’s distinction between reconciliatory and alienating forms of recognition, the latter being forms of life “structured through relations of mutual recognition” but wholly lacking in “any richer conception of orienting goods to that form of life” (142).

The next two chapters focus on post-Hegelian historical developments of the concept of recognition. Daniel Brudney’s essay, “Producing for Others,” carefully, even painstakingly, examines the “social-recognition activity” (151) characteristic of the true communist society envisioned by the young Marx. Brudney aims both to reconstruct and to defend the general plausibility of Marx’s account of the social basis of the self-worth of members of a communist society. The core insight here is Marx’s idea that communist self-realization is self-realization through others, which requires that individuals within a communist society adopt a stance of mutual concern toward one another. Although it is presented in thoroughly sober and dry prose, Brudney’s essay advances the rather radical conclusion that Marx’s picture of the true communist society has enough conceptual plausibility to be regarded as a realistic utopia, worthy of comparison to other realistic utopian visions of the well-ordered society. Unfortunately, Brudney defers discussion of the very important issue of whether or not Marx’s concern-based model of social recognition rests on an overly optimistic understanding of human nature (see 179).

However, it is precisely this relationship — between social recognition and human nature — that is central to Andreas Wildt’s contribution to this volume, “‘Recognition’ in Psychoanalysis.” Wildt notes that the term ‘recognition’ is relatively new to psychoanalytic terminology, having been imported into psychoanalytic theory by both contemporary Kleinians and intersubjective theorists. Moreover, within psychoanalytic theory, the term ‘recognition’ has two distinct meanings with correspondingly distinct normative valences. Kleinians tend to use the term to refer to what Wildt calls “propositional” recognition, which refers to the reluctant acceptance of certain facts, such as, for example, the infant’s painful acceptance of the fact that he is entirely dependent on the mother while she is an independent person with her own needs and desires. By contrast, intersubjective theorists tend to use the term to refer to what Wildt calls “personal” recognition, which refers to the positive affirmation of another person.

Unfortunately, as Wildt shows convincingly, psychoanalytic theorists often do not distinguish between these two senses of recognition when they use the term, and hence the use of this concept in psychoanalytic theory tends to be muddled and confused. Finally, although Wildt acknowledges that personal recognition is central to a healthy self-relation (and that acceptance of this fact is central to propositional recognition), he expresses skepticism about a core assumption of intersubjective psychoanalysis: namely, that the capacity for propositional recognition presupposes that the child be recognized personally — in the sense of having a positive, affirmative, mutual recognition relationship with his mother. Wildt’s skepticism is rooted both in his doubts that it makes sense to apply the notion of personal recognition to small children at all and in his doubts about the optimistic conception of human nature that underlies the emphasis on personal recognition in intersubjective psychoanalysis.

With the next five essays, the focus of the collection shifts to contemporary debates about recognition within social and political theory. The central issue in this part of the book is whether the concept of recognition can serve as the basis for a general framework for critical social theory, or whether it must to be supplemented or combined with some other concepts, such as economic redistribution, in order to effectively diagnose the ills of contemporary societies. This issue was central to a very influential published exchange between Nancy Fraser and Honneth,1 and each of the five essays in this section responds in its own way to that earlier debate.

The section opens with a reprint of one of Fraser’s earlier essays, entitled “Rethinking Recognition.” Here, Fraser is critical of recognition theory (and politics) for its tendencies to displace concerns about economic inequality and to reify group identities. In order to avoid these two problematic tendencies, Fraser contends that recognition theory should be integrated with a critical analysis of economic maldistribution and that recognition should be understood on a status model rather than an identity model. The overall aim of Fraser’s contribution is to situate “the problem of recognition within a larger social frame,” in which the overarching social injustice is not being mis-recognized but rather being deprived of participating in social life on a par with one’s peers (219).

Honneth, by contrast, is critical of Fraser’s attempt to develop a bivalent redistribution-recognition framework for analyzing contemporary societies. Such a framework makes the mistake of dividing the social world up into a norm-free, systemically integrated economic market and a normatively rich, socially integrated lifeworld, and suggests that the concept of recognition is relevant only to the latter.2 Indeed, in his essay, “Work and Recognition: A Redefinition,” Honneth contends that in order to develop a truly immanent criticism of contemporary capitalism, we must uncover the norms implicit in capitalist work relations, norms that undergird the reasonable expectations of modern individuals that they be paid a living wage and that they have work that is worthy of recognition (233). Such normative expectations, in Honneth’s view, underlie both individuals’ sense that they are suffering under existing work relations and their struggles for safe and reasonable working conditions. But seeing these normative expectations for what they are requires, in Honneth’s view, analyzing capitalist work relations not through the lens of redistribution but instead through the lens of recognition.

In their contributions, Emmanuel Renault, Hans-Christoph Schmidt am Busch, and Jean-Philippe Deranty all, in somewhat different ways and to differing degrees, side with Honneth in this debate. In making their cases for the capacity of Honneth’s framework to satisfactorily deal with economic injustices, these authors also explore interesting connections between Honneth’s work and that of Marx (Renault), Hegel (Schmidt am Busch), and contemporary “alternative” economic theories (Deranty).

The last two essays in the collection are more analytic in style, and they focus on the task of conceptual clarification. For that reason, one could have imagined them being placed at the beginning rather than the end of the volume, and less historically or social-theoretically inclined readers may want to begin their reading here. These two essays also speak directly to one another, with Arto Laitinen’s “On the Scope of ‘Recognition’: The Role of Adequate Regard and Mutuality” defending a two-part account of the concept which distinguishes between “adequate regard” forms and “mutual” forms of recognition, and Heikki Ikäheimo’s “Making the Best of What We Are: Recognition as an Ontological and Ethical Concept” defending a monistic account according to which recognition entails “taking something/someone as a person.” While Laitinen contends that his two-part account is needed in order to do justice to the different insights that tend to be at work in different conceptions of recognition, Ikäheimo maintains that his account of recognition unifies the seemingly diverse usages of the term in historical scholarship on Hegel and German Idealism and in contemporary social and political theory.

Although the last two essays, together with Wildt’s, leave open the question of whether the different theorists discussed and represented here are even talking about the same thing when they talk about recognition, the volume as a whole amply displays the richness and fecundity of the recognition paradigm for exploring fundamental questions in social and political theory, as well as in ontology, the metaphysics of human agency, and the study of human nature. Moreover, the book provides compelling evidence for the truth of Zurn’s claim that “the best work in the philosophy of recognition occurs precisely where the two perspectives [historical and contemporary] meet and fruitfully interact” (11).

1 Nancy Fraser and Axel Honneth, Redistribution or Recognition? A Political-Philosophical Exchange (London: Verso, 2003).

2 Presumably Honneth would be similarly critical of Fraser’s attempt to expand her framework of justice into a tri-partite model, which includes redistribution, recognition and representation. See Nancy Fraser, Scales of Justice: Reimagining Political Space in a Globalizing World (New York: Columbia University Press, 2009).