The Philosophy of Simone de Beauvoir: Ambiguity, Conversion, Resistance

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Penelope Deutscher, The Philosophy of Simone de Beauvoir: Ambiguity, Conversion, Resistance, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 199pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521885201.

Reviewed by Gail Weiss, The George Washington University


Penelope Deutscher's The Philosophy of Simone de Beauvoir: Ambiguity, Conversion, Resistance is a wonderful addition to the Beauvoirian canon. Meticulously researched, this book offers an original interpretation of central existential concepts including ambiguity, repetition, freedom, alterity, reciprocity, and sedimentation, and their changing meanings in Beauvoir's work. Deutscher is thoroughly familiar with the growing body of Beauvoir scholarship and she does a masterful job of integrating key insights from Beauvoir's many commentators into her analysis. The animating concept that structures the text as a whole is "conversion," a term that Deutscher takes up from Beauvoir and uses both literally and metaphorically as a way of understanding Beauvoir's own philosophical methodology. Throughout the book, Deutscher shows us the creative and often conflicting ways in which Beauvoir appropriates and transforms the phenomenological, existential, anthropological, Marxist, critical race, and psychoanalytic insights of her predecessors and peers to address oppressive phenomena such as sexism, racism, and ageism. Each chapter focuses on a particular "conversion" (ambiguity, bad faith, repetition, alterity, and reciprocity), and together they provide: 1) close readings of how other authors including Marx, Husserl, Heidegger, Sartre, Levinas, Merleau-Ponty, Levi-Strauss, Wright, Myrdal, Kristeva, and Freud have described this experience; 2) detailed analyses of how Beauvoir interprets these experiences in her own work at varied points in time; and 3) provocative suggestions for how to further develop Beauvoir's insights regarding the existential and ethical significance of ambiguity, alterity, reciprocity, and vulnerability to combat social and political marginalization.

One of the refreshing virtues of The Philosophy of Simone de Beauvoir is that it does not attempt to minimize the discordances that arise out of Beauvoir's conversion of a particular concept and/or experience within and across different texts. Indeed, Deutscher views these conflicts as inevitable (insofar as they are a constitutive feature of the phenomenon being described), and productive (to the extent that they encourage a "thicker," more accurate understanding of the complexities of a particular social, ethical and/or political reality). She argues that

not only did Beauvoir use multiple theoretical models that were inconsistent, if not incompatible with each other, and not only did Beauvoir, in converting them, sometimes allow them to convert each other, but as she progressively distilled a conceptual web out of this process, concepts that became part of her lexicon began to enter into dialogue with each other." (17)

Thus, rather than trying to provide coherent portrayals of ambiguity, reciprocity, sex, gender, racial identities, and the temporality of aging by seeking to reconcile (in a Hegelian aufhebung) the conflicting views that Beauvoir, her predecessors, and her commentators have about them, Deutscher mines the tensions that arise out of Beauvoir's changing understanding of how these phenomena intersect with, are interdependent upon, and constantly inform one another.

One of the most interesting and novel contributions Deutscher makes to contemporary Beauvoir scholarship is the notion of "auto-resistance" that she develops to describe Beauvoir's tendency to offer conflicting interpretations of her own (as well as others') positions. Deutscher describes auto-resistance as an "internal dialogue in Beauvoir's work between different variations on a concept" in which "the author both posits a definition and establishes alternative and competing variations on it." (93) One important consequence of the multiple perspectives Beauvoir brings to bear on a given phenomenon, according to Deutscher, is the "tacit and critical" dialogue that they produce. Deutscher identifies many such moments in Beauvoir's work such as the latter's "simultaneously adhering to an ethics of ambiguity and calling that ethics into question." (53) Deutscher points out, moreover, that when tensions do arise among different conceptions of a given phenomenon in Beauvoir's work, the latter almost always fails to acknowledge them. This leaves the reader with the job of deciding how to interpret their significance. Deutscher's argument is that rather than undermine Beauvoir's analysis, these inconsistencies actually are an attempt to do justice to the complexity of the phenomena under consideration. While much of the auto-resistance in Beauvoir's oeuvre seems tied to her unique method, namely, the different types of conversions she performs as she transforms particular theorists' concepts to apply them to her own spheres of concern, especially sex, gender, race, and aging, Deutscher focuses in particular on the auto-resistances that arise as Beauvoir revisits her earlier understandings of central concepts such as ambiguity, alterity, and the interrelationships between race and sex in her later work, especially in her landmark study of aging, The Coming of Age (La Vieillesse).

By pursuing the transformations in Beauvoir's own thinking about ambiguity, alienation, vulnerability, and the intersections of race, gender, and class from her early to her later works, Deutscher presents a fascinating account of how Beauvoir's thought evolved as she herself became older and began to reckon seriously with the alterations in perspective that inform how one is viewed by others and how one views oneself when one is (perceived as) elderly. Indeed, Deutscher proposes that "aging should be considered the vehicle for Beauvoir's further considerations of identity, alterity, and coexistence, thereby establishing relations of auto-resistance between ethical and political tenors in her work." (173) To give but one example of the trajectory of conversion that produces auto-resistance, Deutscher illustrates how Beauvoir converts Marx's concept of alienation (and, more specifically, alienated labor) in The Second Sex, by applying it to women's alienation from their own bodies in a patriarchal society (in which their bodies are objectified as the feminine other), and goes on to show how Beauvoir provides a new understanding of alterity in The Coming of Age that stems from her recognition that while the feminine other can remain a mystery to a man who doesn't seek to understand her, the aged other directly inhabits us since it is who we ourselves become unless we die young. This important difference in the way one lives gender alterity as compared to the alterity of old age leads, Deutscher argues, to Beauvoir's providing a more nuanced and satisfying account of the multiple forms of alterity operative in human existence in The Coming of Age. By focusing on the many untapped philosophical (especially ethical) resources in The Coming of Age, moreover, Deutscher also makes a compelling call for Beauvoir scholars to pay serious attention to that largely neglected text.[1]

The Philosophy of Simone de Beauvoir has a very ambitious agenda and marks a significant advance in contemporary Beauvoir scholarship (as well as French feminist and twentieth-century Continental scholarship more generally). It offers a multi-faceted critical analysis of both well-known and lesser-known influences on Beauvoir's work, and rethinks the significance of key Beauvoirian concepts in the process. Throughout the book, Deutscher performs her own conversions of Beauvoir's conversions, skillfully weaving a whole host of other voices (including Beauvoir's philosophical interlocutors, her own multiple texts, and the views of her many commentators) into the discussion. For me, the most promising and exciting aspects of the analysis emerge when Deutscher takes the analysis one step further, indicating how one could build upon Beauvoir's increasingly intersectionalist understandings of sex, gender, race, the temporality of aging, and class to chart future directions for feminist theory, critical race theory, ethics, and social and political theorizing. However, and most likely precisely because she is already doing so much, Deutscher tends to content herself with pointing out some promising avenues for future exploration, rather than developing these latter in depth. Indeed, frequently she reserves some of her most profound and original observations about the implications of her analysis for the voluminous footnotes that constitute at least one-third of the text as a whole.

One case in point occurs in footnote 61 of chapter five where she all too briefly refers to Beauvoir's "implicit ethic" which, Deutscher claims, is at the same time a "politics addressing equivalence." Just as the reader is starting to think seriously about the case Deutscher is making for Beauvoir's depiction of the intertwining of the ethical and the political, and grappling with the difference between the implicit ethic Deutscher is identifying in contrast with the more well-known ethics of ambiguity put forward in The Ethics of Ambiguity, Deutscher adds that Beauvoir is also offering a new model of equivalence that does not depend on the traditional conception of "likeness." Beauvoir's alternative model, Deutscher asserts, is an equivalence founded upon "shared vulnerability." (176) All of these statements demand further discussion, and offer a marvelous opportunity for Deutscher to identify the contribution her original reading of Beauvoir could make to contemporary feminist ethics, especially an ethics of care. Even though the fragility of human existence as a hallmark of equivalence is brilliantly treated in the ensuing discussion in the main body of the text (177), more needs to be said to flesh out all of these provocative claims and their interrelations. Instead, Deutscher all too quickly moves on to a new, albeit intersecting set of concerns about an equally fascinating topic, namely what she calls a "generalized identity as aging" which she believes Beauvoir is seeking at "the heart of the normal," and which Deutscher argues can help to disturb "the marginalization and depreciation of the aged." (177-178)

Despite my occasional disappointment in not seeing Deutscher go further in pursuing a particular "line of flight" in her analysis of Beauvoir's work, this also leaves exciting new work for Deutscher and for others to pursue in the future. Deutscher's virtuosity in pulling so many different strands together into a first-rate critical analysis of Beauvoir's philosophical and literary corpus has the potential to revise the way her texts have been, are being, and will be interpreted by past, present, and future commentators. It is also a wonderful model of rigorous scholarship and Deutscher is incredibly generous in acknowledging as many of Beauvoir's commentators' contributions as she possibly can (sometimes this runs the danger of becoming a positive fault as in footnote 53 on page 109 in chapter three when one secondary source after another is cited without any commentary on Deutscher's own position regarding the claims each author is making). For readers both old and new to Beauvoir's work, however, the bibliographical references in the footnotes provide a veritable "who's who" of both well-known and lesser-known scholars who have been influenced by Beauvoir, and is a major research contribution in its own right.

Although I would have preferred another name for the text given how many previously published studies of Beauvoir have "The Philosophy of Simone de Beauvoir" embedded in their titles (and my guess is that the title choice was probably heavily influenced by a publisher concerned with increasing the book's marketability), the text lives up to its promise of giving us a better understanding of Beauvoir's unique philosophy, a philosophy that, as Deutscher powerfully illustrates, was revolutionary for its time, and has the potential to transform radically the time to come.

[1] A notable exception in this regard is the February 2008 Beauvoir centennial conference organized by Silvia Stoller at the University of Vienna in which all the presentations focused on The Coming of Age. A forthcoming volume entitled On Simone de Beauvoir's The Coming of Age edited by Helen Fielding, Dorothea Olkowski, and Silvia Stoller is under consideration at Indiana University Press as volume two of the Time in Feminist Thinking/Experience/Discourse series and will, we hope, be published within the next two years.