The Philosophy of Sociality: The Shared Point of View

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Raimo Tuomela, The Philosophy of Sociality: The Shared Point of View, Oxford University Press, 2007, 318pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195313390.

Reviewed by Kenneth Shockley, University at Buffalo, SUNY


Raimo Tuomela's most recent book significantly advances his ongoing research program into the full range of the social aspects of human life. Like his previous work, The Philosophy of Sociality is written with extraordinary analytic rigor. The work is technical and dense, but presented with extraordinary precision.

Tuomela's basic aim is to explain what he calls the "we-mode" of reasoning, intending, and acting. The "we-mode," broadly the perspective one takes as a member of a group, is to be contrasted with the "I-mode," broadly the perspective one takes as an individual. This contrast is designed to differentiate the personal (or "private," a term Tuomela tends to prefer) from the social, and hence to provide a distinguishing characteristic of the social. His project, then, can be seen as the development of a framework for understanding our basic social notions by providing a systematic account of the "we-mode." He argues that functioning in the "we-mode" is a necessary feature of collective intentionality. Collective intentionality, in turn, serves as a prerequisite for a wide range of social phenomena, including institutions, social practices, and small scale, every day groups of people sharing some common interest, goal or value.

While his understanding of collective intentionality is expansive in scope, it is nonreductive in the sense that collective intentions cannot be reduced to individual intentions; collective intentions should be analyzed in terms of the "we-mode" which cannot be reduced to the "I-mode." At the same time Tuomela is at great pains to indicate that, at bottom, there remains nothing but individuals. This can be seen in that the contrast between the social and the personal is spelled out functionally. The we-mode, as the I-mode, is a mode of reasoning, believing, and approaching the world possessed by individuals, not by collectives. This balance, between a reductive account of entities and a non-reductive account of intentionality, shapes his intriguing theory. It also allows us to distinguish Tuomela's account from those of theorists who take certain social notions to be primitive (Gilbert 1989, 2000) and those who take social notions like collective intentionality to be no more than aggregations or summations of individual intentions, desires, actions, and beliefs (Quinton 1975). Further, claiming that collective intentions are not merely interdependent individual or personal intentions distinguishes his position from that of Michael Bratman (1999). Tuomela notes that Bratmans's account does not allow for "full-blown group reason[s]" (100), that is, reasons in the "we-mode." On such an account the reasons individuals have to perform their part are their own, private reasons. Similarly, their intentions are also their own. Therefore those with an individualist bent of the sort Bratman expresses will be unable to account for the full range of sociality.

Tuomela relies on certain forms of irreducible collective acceptance and, for full blooded collective intention, collective authority over that intention. Yet he also takes a much more reductionist view of collective intentionality than Gilbert (1989, 2000) or Pettit (2003), both of whom take there to be cases -- many cases for Gilbert, not so many for Pettit (2007) -- wherein the collective itself is seemingly capable of possessing intentions, and even, on occasion, engaging in collective action.

The position Tuomela develops, then, constitutes a form of individualism that is less ontologically expansive than Gilbert's, while remaining significantly less reductive than Bratman's. We-mode behavior, intentions, actions, and desires cannot be reduced to individualistic I-mode states. Yet there is nothing that may be in possession of these states apart from individuals. The position having most in common with Tuomela's in this regard is Searle's (1995). However, according to Tuomela, Searle's account of collective intention is markedly underdeveloped in that it leaves the core notion of "collectivity almost unanalyzed" (273n38). As he develops such an account in extraordinary detail, Tuomela greatly advances the field.

Tuomela divides his text into two parts. In the first he presents his theory and its defense; in the second he puts that framework into action. The framework is complicated and covers an impressive range of material, but I will limit my remarks to a brief summary of some of the more crucial features and a few inquisitive comments. The second half of the book provides sophisticated and intriguing accounts of cooperation, social institutions, the cultural evolution of sociality, and group responsibility. While a good deal could be said about any one of these topics, I will limit my comments below to his account of group action and responsibility.

Tuomela begins by distinguishing two ways one can act and function as a member of a group. To do this Tuomela relies on the idea that groups are constituted by an ethos, and that the relationship of members to that ethos determines the nature of the group those members compose. As he puts it,

The ethos of group g in its strict sense is defined as the set of constitutive goals, values, beliefs, standards, norms, practices, and/or traditions that give motivating reasons for action. The notion of ethos can be understood in the wide sense in which every group can be taken to have an ethos, which in weakest cases may consist just of some basic shared ends or beliefs that are possibly unreflected [upon] and not clearly articulated and understood. (16)

There are two ways one can act as a member of a group, according to Tuomela. One can adopt the ethos as an end that one promotes personally, or one can adopt the ethos as an end that one promotes or accepts "for the group" (17). The central contrast seems to be between adopting a group's ethos as one's own end, characteristic of I-mode, private action, and adopting a group's ethos in a way that stands or falls together with other members (17). This contrast in mode generates a contrast between we-mode and I-mode groups. The groups presupposed by we-mode attitudes, reasons, and beliefs are constructed by means of collective acceptance; they are groups wherein the members collectively accept the ethos as a common end. No such collective acceptance is required for I-mode groups. With this contrast in place, Tuomela is able to account for thin social groups, collections of individuals with complementary individual aims, while still allowing for thicker groups that cannot be so represented (42ff).

The promotion of the ethos as a common end does a great deal of work in Tuomela's account. But one might worry that the ethos of a group may not be a simple thing. When Tuomela does reference the complicated nature of group-ethos, and the possibility of subgroups with their own ethos, he takes it that those subgroups will share a common nucleus, a common core ethos (16). This presumption of a unifying ethos might work for simple groups and formally structured groups (families and corporations), but it seems less clear that it is always the case for all groups. The ethos surrounding more complicated groups, like cultures or extended circles of friends, may involve no core, and only overlapping shared ethos to which transitivity need not apply. As a comprehensive treatment of social groups, this acknowledged oversimplification (255n7) seems an unstable foundation on which to build a theory.

The second chapter provides further discussion of the contrast between we-mode and I-mode, along with what Tuomela refers to as the "Collectivity Condition," a condition that allows one to distinguish the two modes more formally. When considering the difference between acting as an individual and acting as a group member, between operating in the I-mode and operating in the we-mode, Tuomela sensibly understands the difference positionally. For example, one has a different set of reasons qua group member from those one has otherwise. Tuomela understands being a group member in terms of the Collectivity Condition. The Condition "involves the idea of the group members necessarily 'standing or falling together' concerning group-relevant activities and items" (16) and is said to be "a constitutive principle of the we-mode" (28). The Condition indicates what it is to operate in the we-mode, and, thus, to function "as a group member in the full sense" (19). In making this connection between membership and the we-mode, the Collectivity Condition links the irreducibility of Tuomela's account of collective intentionality (and, therefore, sociality) to his positional account of group membership. More formally, with respect "to any attitude" (ATT) with content p, we get the following expression of the Collectivity Condition:

It is necessarily true (on quasi-conceptual grounds, thus on analytic a posteriori grounds) that the participants' shared we-attitude toward p (here assumed equivalent to the group's attitude toward p, that is ATT (g,p)) is satisfied for a member Ai of g (qua a member of g) if and only if it is satisfied for every other member of g (qua a member of g). (49)

Insofar as one's attitudes stand and fall with those others with whom one shares membership in a group, that is, with whom one is jointly committed to a shared ethos, one is operating in the we-mode. This condition provides for a formal separation between operating in the I-mode and operating in the we-mode. It also emphasizes his positional understanding of collective intentionality, collective belief, and all other manner of collective and social phenomena.

Armed with the Collectivity Condition as the underpinning theoretical distinction, Tuomela then uses the we-mode/I-mode distinction to build accounts of we-attitudes (chapter three), we-intentions (chapter four), we-mode joint action as a group (chapter five), and group belief (chapter six). The general line of reasoning is clear. Insofar as individuals function as members, that is, insofar as the beliefs, attitudes, actions, and desires to which they contribute as members are subject to the Collectivity Condition, they are operating in the we-mode, rather than the I-mode. As there is a functional difference between the two indicating a difference in kind between the two modes, there can be no reduction of the we-mode to the I-mode. Of course, Tuomela provides a much more detailed and technical set of arguments, capturing the subtle and not so subtle differences among desires, intentions, actions, and beliefs.

Since Tuomela's position is, in essence, an account of collective intentionality, it deserves and receives special consideration. With his distinction between I-mode groups and we-mode groups he is able to distinguish between I-mode joint intentions and we-mode intentions. While many intentions may involve the interdependence of individual intentions, there may be others that require collective acceptance of those intentions and satisfaction of the Collectivity Condition. While we may intend to lift a table jointly because we both individually intend to lift the table (in line with our individual ends and goals) we might also intend to lift the table as a group with collective commitment (100-102). In this latter case the ethos of the group provides the ends, aims and goals of our (we-)intention.

Once collective intentionality is set, group action falls in line. If one can intend as a collective, in the stronger we-mode sense, and the success conditions associated with that intention are only available in we-mode terms, then it seems implausible to deny collective action (101). Insofar as we can intend to lift the table, and are capable of lifting the table only as a collective, then it seems only sensible that we, as a collective, can lift the table.

But this account of collective action may give one pause. The account is necessarily positional. That is, what it is for a collective to act is for its individual members to act as group members rather than as private individuals. In Tuomela's terms, it is to act subject to the Collectivity Condition. But acting subject to this condition is not the same as the collective or group acting. It is for individuals to act on behalf of the collective, as proxies for the collective. Collectives only act through we-mode actions of their members (128, 134). This is not the truism that there can be no collective action without individuals to enact it, but that there is no substantial sense in which collectives can be said to be the author of the action. While this might account for many groups, especially less structured groups, it does not allow for the possibility that some groups might themselves be able to act. Tuomela is certainly cognizant of this consequence (145ff, 251), and takes it to be a positive feature of his account. Yet this is a much weaker notion of group action than many might want. Anyone who believes that corporations are capable of action, for example, would disagree.

The closing chapter of Tuomela's text addresses group responsibility. His account is, of course, positional. Groups may be responsible only in the sense that individuals operating in the we-mode, acting within the normative framework of a group's ethos, may be held responsible for performing actions in a way that is "conceptually different" from performing actions as private persons (252). The issue is one of control: insofar as individuals operate in the we-mode and (collectively) act so as to bring something about, they are collectively responsible.

This is consistent with his account of collective action. Indeed, given this account there is little else he could have consistently said. And there is a strong intuition in support of Tuomela's position: insofar as collectives cannot act without the actions of individuals (operating in the we-mode), then those acting individuals are to be held responsible. If they are acting as individuals then, presumably, they are to be held responsible as individuals. If they are acting as members of a group, then they are to be held responsible as members of a group. As groups per se cannot intend, they cannot be held responsible (105). There is no place for any additional responsibility for the group itself as there is no possibility of appropriately tying the group to any action or intention. While it is true that collectives cannot exist, let alone act, without individuals, one might worry that collectives are capable of bringing about certain states of affairs that individuals are not (consider a group engaged in a complicated act of extortion). For certain groups, corporations perhaps, it may well make sense to say that while there is plenty of individual responsibility, positional and personal, to go around, there may be responsibility properly attributed to the collective itself (of course punishment for distinctively moral wrongdoing is a more complicated matter). At least this seems to be a possibility. Yet Tuomela's account rules it out.

Throughout the text a good deal of effort is spent summarizing and anticipating positions, distinctions, and even definitions. While this helps unify his technical, complicated, systematic approach to sociality, it also hampers the book's flow. That said, the text provides sophisticated and insightful treatments of a wide range of issues at the intersection of the philosophy of the social sciences, ethics, and metaphysics, most of which I have not been able to address here. Tuomela's account of sociality deserves the attention of, and a careful read by, anyone interested in the growing literature on social groups, collective intentionality, and the philosophy of social science.


Bratman, Michael. 1999. Faces of Intention, Cambridge University Press.

Gilbert, Margaret. 2000. Sociality and Responsibility, Rowman and Littlefield.

Gilbert, Margaret. 1989. On Social Facts, Routledge.

Pettit, Philip. 2003. "Groups with Minds of their Own" in Schmitt F. (ed) Socializing Metaphysics, Rowman and Littlefield, pp. 167-93.

Pettit, Philip. 2007. "Responsibility Incorporated," Ethics 117: 171-201.

Quinton, Anthony. 1975. "Social Objects," Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 75: 67-87.

Searle, John. 1995. The Construction of Social Reality, Free Press.