The Philosophy of the Young Leibniz

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Mark Kulstad, Mogens Laerke, and David Snyder (eds.), The Philosophy of the Young Leibniz, Franz Steiner, 2009, 259pp., $61.00 (pbk), ISBN 9783515080989.

Reviewed by Ohad Nachtomy, Fordham University



In his influential book, A Critical Exposition of the Philosophy of Leibniz, written at the beginning of the 20th century, Bertrand Russell argued that many of the strange features of Leibniz’s late philosophy, exemplified in the Monadology, can be clarified by examining his unpublished early manuscripts. For Russell, the early writings shed light on the logical foundations of Leibniz’s system. Much of Leibniz’s scholarship in the 20th century has shown that Russell’s logicist reading of Leibniz is very problematic and that logic is only one of the foundations of Leibniz’s philosophy. Yet Russell’s idea of delving into early writings and unpublished notes has been widely adapted and has proved very useful in Leibniz scholarship ever since. The present volume may be seen as a culmination of this approach, in that it both makes Leibniz’s early work more accessible and ascribes great importance to it.

Indeed, according to the editors,

The object of this volume is to shed new light on the philosophy of the young Leibniz, taking into account the considerable progress in the publication of works by and about the young Leibniz in recent years — editions, translations, and commentaries (p. 7).

The volume, which consists of a selection of 19 articles of 60 presented at an international conference at Rice University in 2003, is a very welcome publication of some very interesting and rich articles on diverse themes in Leibniz’s early work. No doubt, these articles will be very useful to Leibniz scholars with similar interests. A fully successful realization of the editor’s objective, however, would require that the words ‘new’ and ‘recent’ be permitted a lax interpretation. It is to be regretted that such an excellent volume took so long to be published. Even for historians of philosophy, six years is a long time. Certainly, the very organization of an international conference on this theme — The Philosophy of the Young Leibniz — points to a great interest in the early writings of Leibniz. The editors have wisely defined ‘young’ as anything preceding 1686, a year which, with the publication of the Discourse on Metaphysics, marks a first full articulation (though not publication) of what may be called Leibniz’s mature philosophy.

The editors’ thin introduction, however, does not tell us much about the reasons for the interest in the work of the young Leibniz. I suppose that, given the current trend, they simply take it for granted. Indeed, for many Leibniz scholars, this has become obvious, which is a further indication of the state of Leibniz scholarship, if not of history of early modern philosophy in general. In fact, other than manifesting and making public the interest of scholars in the philosophy of the young Leibniz, the selection of articles published in this volume lacks a unifying theme or a coherent rationale. Thus it is worth noting, for those outside the Leibniz circle, some of the questions that have preoccupied Leibniz scholars in the last two decades: What are the main sources for Leibniz’s early work (e.g., modern vs. ancient)? To what extent is Leibniz’s mature philosophy already present and foreshadowed in his early work? More ambitiously still, what is the precise dating and a full picture of Leibniz’s philosophical development? Is it progressive and continuous or discontinuous?

Now that a much fuller picture of Leibniz’s writing is exposed, one could get the impression that Leibniz is going in different directions as he moves along, without a single coherent system. On this front, two publications are worth noting: Christia Mercer’s 2001 book, the thesis of which is that Leibniz’s philosophy was more or less in place as early as 1671 (both Goldenbaum and Laerke’s contributions engage this position), and Daniel Garber’s recent book (2009), which traces Leibniz’s philosophy as a lab in which Leibniz is experimenting, thinking and rethinking his views, and argues that they never reached full crystallization. Worth noting, too, in this connection is the influential work of Michel Fichant, who traces in a precise and careful manner the genesis of Leibniz’s philosophy (see for instance his introduction to his edition of the Discours de métaphysique suivi de Monadologie, Gallimard, 2004) and Catherine Wilson’s earlier Leibniz’s Metaphysics (1989), which identifies the coexistence of different strands in Leibniz’s work. A related question, and one that never fails to excite controversy, is the extent of Spinoza’s influence on Leibniz, to which about third of the present volume is dedicated. Here the recent book (2008) of one of the editors, Mogens Laerke, is most pertinent.

Some of the excellent articles in the volume address specific questions of dating. For example, Richard Arthur makes a very convincing argument that Leibniz’s syncategorematic view of infinitesimals was developed in the very early 1670s and matured in 1676. In his contribution, Daniel Garber asks “What Did Leibniz Learn about Body in January1678?” and responds: “Not Much”. This response, at once surprising and intriguing, shows the concern Leibniz scholars have developed for a very precise picture of the development of his views. Other papers, such as those by Philip Beeley, Stuart Brown, Stephen Daniels and Ursula Goldenbaum, make significant contributions to understanding the background and sources of Leibniz’s thought on specific topics (infinity, separated animals, Ramism, and natural law, respectively). Four of the 12 articles in the first part of the book focus on Leibniz’s developing views of mathematics and infinity and their impact on his philosophy. This shows a growing interest in the question of infinity in Leibniz’s philosophy, which indeed deserves more attention. The other papers in this part are concerned with particular questions in early Leibniz texts: Sean Greenberg examines fatalism and the nature of Leibnizian freedom; Sukjae Lee writes on divine concurrence and occasionalism in 1677; Laurence McCullough writes on individuation as an anatomic and physiologic principle in Leibniz’s metaphysics; Gianfranco Mormino writes on self-punishment and avenging justice; and Marine Picon examines the constitution of Leibnizian formalism.

In the second part, dedicated to Leibniz/Spinoza relations, we find Martine de Gaudemar investigating the early Leibniz’s conception of the mind in his comments on Spinoza; Ursula Goldenbaum arguing that Leibniz’s foundation of natural law should be seen as the outcome of his struggle with Hobbes’ and Spinoza’s naturalism; and Mogens Laerke arguing for a quasi-Spinozistic parallelism in the text De Origine Rerum ex Formis (April 1676), which is a part of a broader thesis, presented in his recent book, that Leibniz was entertaining a semi-Spinozist system in 1676. In addition, Frédéric Manzini considers Leibniz’s view of Spinoza’s principle of sufficient reason; Vittorio Morfino examines Leibniz’s Ad Ethicam manuscript; and Elhanan Yakira follows up the theme of his book, considering the question of human freedom in Leibniz and Spinoza.

In conclusion, this volume presents a rich collection of essays, in which every Leibniz scholar will find useful and original material to advance his or her knowledge and enhance their research.

As an afterthought, let me make a remark on the question of printed publication in this digital age, which reading this volume made me reflect on. As I recall, shortly after the conference, Mark Kulstad distributed a CD with the papers presented in the conference. This could have been posted on a (say the conference’s) website and thus would make the printed version (consisting of only a third of the papers) redundant. But is this so? I would say that a rigorous selection of papers, according to a clear rationale and a thorough revision of the papers in light of the conference’s discussion and feedback, surely deserves a printed publication. The present volume does satisfy these criteria. It is wonderful and useful to have excellent papers, fully worked out and edited in the rigorous standards of Studia Leibnitiana, at hand. Yet, as I already noted, the principle of selection and organization here is not sufficiently clear and some of the papers read more or less as conference presentations rather than as fully developed articles. Above all, it is to be regretted that it takes such a long time to get such a book published. If we don’t find ways to make printed publication of a good vintage of conference papers more timely, I suspect that this genre will soon become obsolete.


Fichant, M., Discours de métaphysique suivi de Monadologie, Paris: Gallimard, 2004

Garber, D., Leibniz: Body, Substance, Monad, Oxford: Oxford UP, 2009.

Laerke, M., Leibniz lecteur de Spinoza. La genése d’une opposition complexe, Paris: Honoré Champion, 2008.

Mercer, C., Leibniz’s Metaphysics. Its Origin and Development, Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 2001.

Russell B., A Critical Exposition of the Philosophy of Leibniz, 2nd ed. London: Allen and Unwin, 1937.

Wilson, C., Leibniz’s Metaphysics: A Historical and Comparative Study. Princeton: Princeton UP, 1989.