The Platonic Alcibiades I: The Dialogue and its Ancient Reception

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François Renaud and Harold Tarrant, The Platonic Alcibiades I: The Dialogue and its Ancient Reception, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 292pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9780521199124.

Reviewed by Francisco J. Gonzalez, University of Ottawa


Among the number of possible reasons for studying the ancient reception of a Platonic dialogue, François Renaud and Harold Tarrant define their approach as "the study of the ancient commentators for their possible contributions to current Plato scholarship" (7). They give several reasons that recommend this approach, but I will highlight a general as well as a specific category of reasons: generally, the study of the ancient commentators can be an opportunity to create a critical distance from, and thus reflect on, our current hermeneutical assumptions (9) and even our own conception of what philosophy is (11); specifically, what can be described as the 'unitary' reading of the ancient commentators on the level of the corpus, each individual dialogue, and the tradition, challenges our modern tendencies to compartmentalize the dialogues according to some 'developmental' schema, to neglect the unity of dramatic form and doctrinal content in a focus on the 'arguments', and to emphasize the differences between Plato and other philosophers of the Platonic tradition rather than the continuities (the very use of the term 'Neoplatonist' is symptomatic [153]).

Renaud and Tarrant are to be commended for taking this approach, and their book largely succeeds in showing its fruitfulness. However, the book sometimes seems at odds with the approach it commends. Much of it is dedicated to tracing the early reception of the Alcibiades, a reception that, for reasons to be indicated below, tells us nothing about how to read the dialogue. Secondly, the Alcibiades might appear an odd choice for a volume meant to show what the Ancient commentators might contribute to Platonic scholarship given the many doubts about whether this dialogue is in fact by Plato.

The first chapter, which focuses on the dialogue itself and the issues it raises, does not hide the many indications that the dialogue may be inauthentic. If the "plainness of Alcibiades' responses" suggests "that this dialogue cannot be Plato at his dramatic best" (38), then also that it may not be Plato at all. Furthermore, sharpness, humor and plausibility in the depiction of the encounter between Socrates and Alcibiades are sacrificed to the didactic purpose (40). In general, Renaud and Tarrant speak of "the more didactic, handbook-like nature of the dialogue" (42). They also wonder how Plato could have circulated a dialogue whose politics is so openly anti-democratic without further damaging Socrates' reputation (43). None of this constitutes proof of inauthenticity, of course, but all of it casts serious doubt.

This otherwise very helpful discussion of the dialogue indeed tends both to dismiss evidence of its spuriousness and to exaggerate its philosophical importance. For example, Renaud and Tarrant significantly find the closest parallels to Socrates' clearly unserious monologue in praise of the Persians and the Spartans in dialogues that are clearly spurious: Alcibiades II, Hipparchus, Theages and Minos (51). Yet they refuse to recognize here an argument for spuriousness, trying instead to find a parallel also in the arguably very different case of Socrates' interpretation of Simonides in the Protagoras (52). Renaud and Tarrant then go on to claim that the Alcibiades contains not only "one of the rare discussions of self-knowledge in the Platonic corpus" but "certainly the most fundamental" (57). Yet the only thing that seems to set this discussion apart, in keeping with the general character of the dialogue, is its didactic explicitness. It might state most clearly that "the soul is the human being" (130c6), but do we really need the Alcibiades to tell us what is the clear message, if not stated so dogmatically, of many other dialogues? And the directness with which the doctrine is stated here does not add anything to our understanding of its meaning. Renaud and Tarrant outline two opposed interpretations of the famous passage at 133a-c in which self-knowledge is said to require seeing the divine part of our soul reflected in a soul as in a mirror: the theocentric interpretation, according to which knowing the self requires knowing god (64), and the anthropocentric, according to which knowing the self requires dialogue with another soul like ours (65). But if both interpretations are possible (Renaud and Tarrant themselves favor a compromise, 71), this is because the author of the dialogue is none too clear. The dialogue indeed seems more concerned with conveying doctrines than providing understanding. The authors themselves 'despair' when Socrates' subsequent attempt to raise self-knowledge into a kind of super-art on which everything else depends elicits from Alcibiades only hasty and emphatic assent (76). Even if the dialogue is not Plato at his best rather than being not Plato at all, does not either possibility limit the dialogue's value as a model for how to read Plato's better or authentic dialogues?

The second chapter turns to what Renaud and Tarrant call the 'prereception and early reception' of the dialogue, but its effect, at least on me, is to bring into doubt that there was any such thing. Neither Xenophon (93) nor Aristotle (97) show any awareness of the dialogue, so that when we are told that "The most important influence that the Alcibiades had in early Hellenistic times was probably in the Academy of Polemo" (108), this would in fact be the first evidence we have of any reception of the dialogue whatsoever (if we exclude the Alcibiades II, whose date is not clear and whose connection to the first Alcibiades is not as close as might be thought). But here we must emphasize the 'probably' since the authors conclude only that "Overall there is likelihood that the Alcibiades has some connection with Polemo's Academy" (109), where this likelihood is based on nothing more than the promotion of an idealized love in the Academy at the time, as if this could not have been inspired by the Phaedrus and Symposium alone.

There can in any case be no talk yet of the reception of the dialogue if we understand this in the sense specified on p. 110: "When was it that the dialogue was first interpreted as identifying us with our souls, and when was this practice of reading it very early in a programme of education first introduced?" Renaud and Tarrant try to find this more specific reception in Cicero, but their case is extremely unconvincing. First, the "very strong similarities with the Alcibiades" that they claim to find in Cicero all concern traits not unique to the Alcibiades but found also in other dialogues (118). The one arguably unique trait, i.e., the idea of self-knowledge as requiring reflection by another soul, is not found in Cicero. Renaud and Tarrant counter (119) that the notion of 'image' is found in De Legibus (1.58), but the image there has nothing to do with another soul (114). They must in conclusion allow that Cicero may have had no direct access to the dialogue, noting that "this reception conceals all but completely the dramatic dimension of the original" (119). Nothing in fact requires us to believe that Cicero had even the remotest contact with the dialogue.

The case for Plutarch's knowledge of the dialogue is also unpersuasive. Renaud and Tarrant claim that Plutarch "must" be referring to Alcibiades 122b1-2 in his Life of Alcibiades since he there cites Plato as his source for Zopyrus being a teacher of Alcibiades and the dialogue Alcibiades is "the only place in the corpus where Zopyrus is named" (128). The striking fact, however, is that this trivial reference in a nonphilosophical work would be the only clear reference Plutarch makes to the dialogue. Renaud and Tarrant are thus reduced to claiming that while Plutarch makes no direct allusions to the Alcibiades in philosophical writings that address common topics (e.g., the Socratic daimonion, Platonic eros), the fact that he refers to the dialogue once suggests that he has it in the back of his mind elsewhere (see 136).

It is not until Albinus in the second century, i.e., half a millennium after Plato supposedly wrote the dialogue, that we get its first clear reception in the sense specified above (140). But even at this period there is no evidence of any great interest in the dialogue. This is presumably why Renaud and Tarrant adopt a very odd strategy in trying to show the contrary. They acknowledge that the anonymous Theaetetus commentary from this period does not mention the Alcibiades. Yet they claim that the commentator's reference to Platonic 'erotica', in which it is claimed that the serious person is able to recognize those worthy of love, must include a reference to the Alcibiades. Why? Because this is "the only dialogue that documents the process of philosophic seduction and the beneficial treatment of the beloved" (142): a statement that requires us to believe that neither the Phaedrus nor the Lysis do this. Renaud and Tarrant see their suggestion as in any case 'clinched' by a passage of Hermias' commentary on the Phaedrus in which he describes the Alcibiades as "teaching that one should seek out the one worthy of love and distinguish whom one should love." Hermias is of course writing a few centuries later, but Renaud and Tarrant conclude:

"It therefore appears that the Platonic tradition in antiquity considered the Alcibiades such a work for many centuries, and this confirms that the anonymous author of the Theaetetus-commentary, who probably wrote well before AD 150, would have had this dialogue in particular in mind" (143).

Can what is written by Hermias really count as evidence for what another author had in mind several centuries earlier?

There is only one commentary-like exegesis of the Alcibiades from this period, that of Harpocration, but all we know from the fragment that survives is his construction of an argument for Socrates being the divine rather than vulgar type of lover (146). As for Alcinous, the evidence is no better than in the case of Plutarch: he makes a clear reference to the dialogue in his work on logic, "so that there was no reason why he should have not been thinking of it elsewhere" (151). Renaud and Tarrant grant that "Certainly he did not make a great deal of direct use of it" (151). In sum, what we are shown in this chapter is very far from supporting the conclusion that the dialogue "had become a significant tool in the armoury of the Platonist teachers of the early empire" (151). What strikes one is how insignificant the dialogue was during this period, so much so that it might as well have not existed.

When chapter three turns to the Neoplatonist reception, Renaud and Tarrant still appear to exaggerate the significance of the dialogue. They claim that in the treatise, What is the living being and what is the human being? (I.I[53]), Plotinus had Alcibiades 129e-133d 'in mind.' But since they grant that Plotinus here does not seek to interpret the passage or establish what it means (158), 'having in mind' appears to mean no more than thinking about issues and distinctions that bear some relation to those found in the dialogue. None of the vague and tenuous similarities they note between Plotinus' treatise and the Alcibiades seem to warrant their claim that "this treatise was written after the Alcibiades (or at least 129e-133d) had been re-read" (158). Likewise, nothing should be inferred from Plotinus' use of the mirror image in another treatise (contra p. 160) since the use there is completely different from that in the Alcibiades. In the case of Porphyry, Renaud and Tarrant find in one fragment, where the Philebus is clearly the dominant influence, some material "likely to be drawn from the Alcibiades" (163). But again, the fact that we have no direct reference to the dialogue, but only reflection on similar themes, makes the 'likelihood' closer to 'possibility'.

It is with Iamblichus, I would argue, that we have for the first time real evidence of a serious philosophical interest in the Alcibiades. He wrote a commentary on the dialogue, of which, unfortunately, only fragments survive. Here we find the view that the dialogue contains 'as in a seed' the whole of Plato's philosophy as presented in the initial curriculum of ten dialogues and that it therefore serves as a perfect introduction; we find also a commitment to the integrity of the dialogue form (the view that every dialogue is a microcosm [166-167; 170]). Indeed, Iamblichus offers a number of guidelines for subsequent Neoplatonist interpretations of the dialogue (172).

With Proclus we arrive at our first surviving detailed interpretation that, even if incomplete, is extensive due to the importance he grants the prologue as Plato's way of shaping and guiding our reading of the dialogue (178; a hermeneutical assumption perhaps found already in Iamblichus, 72). Yet after all the space devoted to finding a reading of the Alcibiades where there arguably is none, Renaud and Tarrant appear oddly dismissive of Proclus' commentary. First, they devote less than ten pages to it (compared to the fifteen pages devoted to Cicero's non-reading of the dialogue!). Furthermore, they introduce Proclus as "in many ways the most impressive of the Neoplatonist interpreters, though this does not mean that he is either the most plausible or the most student-friendly" (177). These vague charges are left unexplained. Despite Proclus's explicit commitment to the principle that Socrates adjusts his words to the character of the interlocutor and his repeated application of this principle to the conversation between Socrates and Alcibiades, Renaud and Tarrant insist that Proclus has no interest in Alcibiades or any other individual, but instead sees the interlocutor only as a universal type (179, 181). Furthermore, despite all the attention Proclus gives to the erotic dimension of the discussion, his reading is dismissed with the claim that 'erotic' here has "the strange sense in which the Neoplatonist understood that word" (186).

A reason for this dismissive attitude towards Proclus appears to be the championing of Olympiodorus, whose commentary on the dialogue receives an entire chapter (over 50 pages). His exegesis, we are told, has "the clear merit of being more sober, more 'philological' and distinctly less theological than that of Iamblichus or Proclus" (190). In contrast to Proclus' supposed disinterest in the individual character of the interlocutor, for Olympiodorus it is important "that what Plato has his characters say depends on who speaks and to whom they speak, and sometimes on why or where they do so -- that is, it depends on the personally relevant reasons why what is said is said" (192). Olympiodorus indeed cannot help but appear to be the whole point of this book in that he is clearly the Neoplatonist interpreter from whom Renaud and Tarrant believe the modern scholar has much to learn. He is like the modern scholar in his 'sobriety' but places much more emphasis on the unity of the dialogue form (201). And if Olympiodorus is only following Proclus in considering the Alcibiades to be "an emphatically erotic dialogue" (206), Renaud and Tarrant devote seven pages to Olympiodorus' interpretation of this dimension of the dialogue without the dismissive comment that he understood 'erotic' in a 'strange sense'.

The last chapter seeks to draw the 'Ancient lessons for the modern interpreter' (247). One is the ability of the ancients to "take literary and dramatic matters as integral to the dialogue and so as something that enhances rather than detracts from the philosophy at its core" (248). This "helped them discover greater unity underlying a dialogue that is often treated today as less coherent and more pastiche-like" (249). But even on the reading provided by Renaud and Tarrant, the Alcibiades does appear less coherent and more pastiche-like than other dialogues; so is it really a good recommendation of the ancient approach? Could not this approach be charged in this case with creating a unity that is not there? Furthermore, the claim that, in the light of the ancient commentaries, the Alcibiades "presents a challenge to anybody who would take a developmentalist approach to Plato but still hold this dialogue to be genuine" (256) is weakened by the fact that developmentalists can and will reject the genuineness of the dialogue for precisely this reason. Finally, the one thing that sets the Alcibiades apart from other dialogues in the (late) ancient reception, i.e., its use as an introduction to the corpus and its exalted status, is one ancient lesson Renaud and Tarrant claim should not be followed (256).

None of the concerns raised above should mask the value of the present book. It sets a model for the study of the ancient reception of Plato's dialogues, both in its meticulous scholarship and in its general hermeneutical approach. It is a treasure trove of valuable information, insights and provocations. It succeeds in making us rethink both a problematic dialogue and our general approach to Plato's dialogues. The only reservation is that its unwillingness to confront the question of authenticity directly, its determination to find ancient readings of the dialogue where none are to be found, and its lopsided focus on one important ancient reading (Olympiodorus) to the detriment of another (Proclus), work against its noble purpose of showing what the study of the ancient commentators has to offer modern Plato scholarship.