The Political Philosophy of Susan Moller Okin

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Debra Satz and Rob Reich (eds.), Toward a Humanist Justice: The Political Philosophy of Susan Moller Okin, Oxford UP, 2009, 251pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195337396.

Reviewed by Ann E. Cudd, University of Kansas



This book originated in a memorial conference held in honor of Susan Moller Okin at Stanford University in February 2005 following her sudden death in 2004. The volume collects 12 original essays, by prominent political theorists and philosophers, about Okin’s work and the themes her work championed. Part I of the book, “Rethinking Political Theory”, includes essays by Nancy Rosenblum, Joshua Cohen, Elizabeth Wingrove, and John Tomasi on Okin’s methodology and her particular form of liberal feminism. Part II, “Gender and the Family”, comprises essays by David Miller, Mary Lyndon Shanley, and Cass Sunstein on Okin’s theory of the construction of gender within families and related social institutions, especially religion. Part III, “Feminism and Cultural Diversity”, includes essays by Ayelet Shachar, Alison Jaggar, and Chandran Kukathas on Okin’s views about the contradictions she saw in combining feminism and multiculturalism. Part IV, “Development and Gender”, presents articles by Robert Keohane and the late Iris Marion Young on the last turn in Okin’s work toward consideration of justice for the global poor. The essays thus take up the four chapters of Okin’s life work: her early work on the place of women in the history of political thought, her middle period in which she grappled with contemporary theories of justice, her later period in which she challenged postcolonial feminists and multiculturalists, and her final couple of years in which she sought to understand global gender injustice. These essays are on the whole excellent; they are each critical of some part of Okin’s philosophy or method. Yet they also invariably illustrate the enormous contributions that her work made to political theory, feminist thought, and, although this comes through perhaps less clearly, methodology.

Nearly all of the articles are well worth reading and re-reading. I would especially single out the articles by Rosenblum, Tomasi, Shanley, Sunstein, and Young as excellent pieces in their own right and as particularly good interrogations of Okin’s work. Rosenblum’s article, “Okin’s Liberal Feminism as a Radical Political Theory”, does a nice job of characterizing Okin’s liberal feminism and revealing its radical potential. Rosenblum compares Okin with her (flawed) hero Mill and argues that their great affinity lies in “a classic liberal opposition to absolutism and arbitrariness and a sense of the despicableness of despots, political or domestic” (21). Okin, Rosenblum points out, discounted sexual difference as the basis for feminism, and thus preferred the term humanism for her own theory. But Okin also held out hope for a genderless future, which could be achieved through a few proposals to end the vulnerability women suffer in contemporary marriage and a gendered economy, and in this way was more radical than Mill or even radical feminists.

Tomasi’s article, “Can Feminism be Liberated from Governmentalism?”, is the only one that emanates from a libertarian direction. Tomasi distinguishes between direct- and indirect-governmental approaches to feminist public policy. The former are legislatively enacted means of feminist social construction, while the latter refer to actions that nongovernmental institutions take to reach feminist ends, supported by governmental enforcement of constitutional rights and liberties. Tomasi recounts an often neglected history of what he calls “indirect-governmental feminist” thought, beginning with Sarah Grimké, to support his view that there can be a feminist line of libertarian thinking that upholds autonomy for women through indirect governmentalism. Okin’s plan, he argues, would be troubling to such feminists because it begins with a pre-determined presumption against gender and uses government to eliminate it, rather than guaranteeing constitutional rights and liberties and allowing the future of gender to unfold as people will. Okin would have responded that the current state of gender inequality creates a bias in favor of the current structures of gender, and so we cannot hope for eventual equality unless we enact laws to counteract gender constructions. Tomasi is right to suggest that this would not pass the liberal legitimacy test, but he has no answer for her analysis of how inherently unequal gender structures reproduce themselves.

Shanley’s article, “‘No More Relevance than One’s Eye Color’: Justice and a Society without Gender” grapples with Okin’s most controversial (among feminists or political theorists) thesis that a just future would be one without gender. Okin viewed gender as a “deeply entrenched social institutionalization of sexual difference” and held that ending male dominance as well as the enhancement of freedom for both sexes required the end of gender roles (Okin, quoted on 113). Yet Okin, as a liberal, also opposed dictating what people did in their private life. She proposed laws and practices that would end women’s economic vulnerability within marriage, but then simply had to hope that gender roles would eventually wither away. Shanley argues that there is “a persistent tension in [Okin’s] thought between her commitment to individual freedom and the neutrality of the state with respect to gender, and her belief that the world would be a better place if we could eliminate gender roles and bring a genderless society into being” (114). Shanley’s article probes this central tension of liberal feminism illuminatingly and, ultimately, approvingly. She points out the optimism that Okin shares with Mill that absent the external social supports for gender, the progressive elements of the human spirit would eliminate gender.

I was disappointed only by the article by Shachar, which attempts to show that Okin was wrong not to consider group rights for women who value their religious identity. The article focuses on those cases where it seems that the women might get some benefit from the right to have a religious court’s decisions enforced by a civil court. Her case involves a divorcing husband who reneges on a promise to provide a religious release for the woman to remarry. I cannot imagine that Okin would be moved by such a case, nor should she be. First, surely the burden is on such religions to release the woman on the basis of his prior promise. What religion worth adhering to would support a liar who has broken his agreement in such a situation? But that release can be attained completely within the religious court’s purview; the state is not needed there. Second, the interest that women and the state have in preserving women’s civil rights and freedom from the demands of religious courts must override the needs of women to have a spiritual promise enforced by a civil authority. Sunstein’s article in this volume does an excellent job of balancing religious freedom against interests in upholding sex discrimination law. I am not sure that Okin would have gone as far as he does in the direction of religion, though. As many of the articles in this book point out, Okin thought gender should disappear as a determinant of any social inequalities whatsoever, a position completely at odds with all existing religions.

Wingrove’s, Jaggar’s, and Young’s articles together portray important aspects of Okin’s methodology, which I think is so far underappreciated. Wingrove’s “Of Linchpins and Other Interpretive Tools” points to the important ways that empirical social science informs Okin’s theory: an “approach to theory that combined an analytic orientation with an empirical sensibility” (55). She also describes it as “thoroughly naturalized” (55). Wingrove is unfortunately less clear in her more detailed account of that method, overly complicating Okin’s use of empirical social science to discover and justify claims about gender injustice. I think that this aspect of Okin’s work would reward a close analysis by a philosopher of social science. One very helpful point, however, is Wingrove’s interpretation of Okin’s use of the linchpin metaphor. While Cohen’s article criticized the metaphor as reductively giving priority to domestic inequality in explaining women’s oppression, Wingrove argues that the linchpin metaphor denies precisely this priority. A linchpin, she points out, “invokes relations of connectivity rather than causality” (60). So the linchpin expresses how “asymmetries of power characteristic of familial relations and the ideologies of domesticity and natural complementarity that sustain those relations secure — connect and fix together — the constituent parts of a perforce multidimensional structure” (61).

Jaggar’s article takes up Okin’s later work and the methodology of Third World feminism that Brooke Ackerly, in her dissertation written under Okin’s supervision, named “listening to the silent voices”. Okin enacted this through reading and citing excerpts from the 1995 Beijing Platform for Action and the 2000 World Bank publication, Voices of the Poor. Jaggar criticizes Okin for using only these sources, which is surely fair enough, but also for her method’s “nondeliberative” nature (178). I take this to refer to a failure to engage in deliberation with the least advantaged. But engaging with subjects requires a completely different methodology than Okin was employing. Such qualitative, interviewing techniques are not easily or quickly mastered, and done badly are likely to produce more harm than good. One could as easily complain that Okin had not mastered econometric theory before citing statistics on the wage gap in her earlier work. Okin consistently employed the method of literature review in her application of empirical social science, and it seems to me to be just as appropriate here as in the earlier work that cited, but did not generate, work by psychologists and economists. Okin’s method required her to use valid, insightful studies, not to perform them herself. The appropriate critique, I submit, would be to point to studies that did better social science, not to suggest that she do that work herself.

Young’s article “The Gendered Cycle of Vulnerability in the Less Developed World”, puts Okin’s central argument in Justice, Gender, and the Family to work by showing a similar pattern in the vulnerability of poor women in less developed countries. This piece highlights a feature of Okin’s methodology that the linchpin metaphor on Wingrove’s analysis describes: Okin sought to connect the internal and external, direct and indirect, economic and psychological causes of women’s oppression that make the bars of women’s cages so strong and yet so difficult to see.

Satz and Reich have honored Okin in the best possible way by bringing together an outstanding volume of critical essays that document and evaluate Susan Okin’s amazing career as a feminist political theorist. Among the accomplishments highlighted, these articles reveal the details and limits of her liberalism and her feminism, and they illuminate her richly empirical methods, and show how her linchpin analyses could have been further extended. By showing us what Okin accomplished and what she had not yet completed, they renew my admiration for what she accomplished, regret for what might yet have been done, and determination to carry on her legacy.