The Pretenses of Loyalty: Locke, Liberal Theory, and American Political Theology

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John Perry, The Pretenses of Loyalty: Locke, Liberal Theory, and American Political Theology, Oxford University Press, 2011, 264pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199756544.

Reviewed by Ingrid Creppell, George Washington University


Immediately before his famous pronouncement to distinguish exactly the separate spheres of government and religion, Locke states one main reason for doing so: to end the interminable confounding of claims by those who pretend to loyalty toward God or toward the civic good. This one phrase serves as the focal point of John Perry's interpretation of Locke's Letter Concerning Toleration and more broadly of his perspective on liberalism's persistent weaknesses. This engrossing, important, sometimes aggravating, and enlightening book should be of interest to a broad audience -- political theorists, philosophers, and theologians examining issues of religion and politics, and those of a more historical bent interested in Locke scholarship and the history of liberalism.

The Pretenses of Loyalty is divided into three main parts: (1) an analysis of what is "missing" in "Johannine liberalism," the paradigmatic approach to the theopolitical problem established by John Locke and reaching modern form in John Rawls, and an reintroduction and definition of the idea of "loyalty"; (2) an interpretation of the evolution of Locke's thought from his early rejection of toleration in the First Tract on Government (1660) to his famous defense in the Letter Concerning Toleration (1689), specifically tied to Locke's recognition of the importance of loyalty and then subsequent occluding of it; and (3) a review of present-day reformulations of the theopolitical problem in the American intellectual landscape. Perry ends with recommendations for how to approach "the just place of religion in public life."

This cursory outline indicates the complexity of his analysis: Perry does not begin with Locke and chronologically lay out the emergence, evolution, and growing ineffectiveness of liberal theory. Rather, he posits the contemporary inadequacy of the classic liberal tradition, retrieves its original promise as well as the elements setting it on the wrong course, and then circles back to modern theoretical and discursive consequences and possibilities. The case is made through exploration of a wide variety of writers and philosophers who have contributed to a dense web of debate about the subject. A notable feature of the book is this virtuosic bringing together of many writers linked via theoretical concerns about religion and politics. Perry traces out with verve and a certainty of voice their "conversation" with one another, with Locke, and with the Lockean American project. His methodology embodies "dialogic pluralism."

In Part I, for instance, contemporary thinkers like Sandel, Galston, Fish, Strauss, and Hauerwas are compared not just to illuminate the types of criticism arrayed against liberalism, but also importantly these thinkers' convergence on the missing element of loyalty. They demonstrate what Perry terms a "turn to loyalty" -- an acknowledgment of the inextricable role played by substantive allegiances and accompanying duties in political thinking and acting. In Part III ("John Locke's America"), he examines three main efforts to achieve a theoretical harmonization for members of religiously and morally diverse modern societies -- those of Richard Neuhaus and Michael Novak, Nicholas Wolterstorff and John Witte, and Martha Nussbaum. One of his more innovative and enlightening chapters (Ch. 6) highlights the similarities between Thomas West, an Episcopalian political philosopher whose work has been enthusiastically promoted by former Attorney General John Ashcroft, and Isaac Kramnick, a stringent Jeffersonian Separatist. Both are explored in some detail and then shown to ignore the problem of loyalty in their portrayal of the American Founding as having solved the theopolitical conflict once and for all: in West's interpretation through a conception of American citizenship as essentially premised upon Christian morality and in Kramnick's through a successful bifurcation (without messy remainder) of religious and political commitments. Neither West nor Kramnick -- despite their antithetical views of religion's role -- believe American theopolitics need suffer from irresolvable dilemmas of the sort found in Antigone, where one's loyalty to country might be fundamentally in conflict with loyalty to one's personal gods.

Bringing myriad writers together in conversation across the philosophical and theological spectrum is integral to the book's purpose: to facilitate a dialogue. Perry himself comes at the task of reading Johannine liberalism from the tradition of his own claimed field -- theological ethics. Can there be a mutual enlarging of imaginations? At times, however, juggling too many balls leaves the reader with unanswered questions about the book's core theoretical claims. I consider three major components of Perry's book.

First, questions arise in Perry's interpretation of Locke. Though he makes the surprising statement that Locke's argument for toleration has not been as thoroughly studied as one might expect (in the past fifteen years nearly seven times as many articles were published on Locke and toleration as appeared in the previous fifteen, i.e., 54 to 8 (Thomas Reuters search)), one takes the point that important areas remain to be explored and his book amply shows the rewards of another in-depth exploration. Perry demonstrates through detailed textual analysis and by situating Locke within the intellectual and political context of his time just how much he bestrode two great eras of Western intellectual life, the natural law tradition on the one hand and the modern turn toward value pluralism and skepticism on the other. He criticizes Locke for taking the wrong turn toward liberal neutrality, but he also emphasizes the profound and procreative nature of Locke's work and its continued influence.

Perry begins by locating Locke's defense of religious freedom in the context of his earlier rejection of toleration. Locke grew to question his initial argument for a repressive government when he witnessed the depth of loyalty displayed by many believers. Perhaps civil peace could be better insured by toleration than by attempting to enforce religious uniformity. Perry's innovation here comes in his lengthy examination of the theological and ecclesiological passages which have perplexed many Locke scholars. The first line of the Letter proclaiming toleration to be the "chief characteristical mark of the true church" is not taken as a throwaway line or a ploy to shame Christians, but a genuine gambit to bring the religiously devout into a conversation. Locke believed it necessary to appeal to religious believers from within their own deep commitments: toleration essentially embodied Christian tenets, not a betrayal of them. Perry interprets Locke as self-consciously attempting to transform conceptions of religious obligation and loyalty as much as political ones, and notes Locke's acute awareness of the power of loyalty here. So Locke did not start out as a Johannine liberal, but becomes one in the subsequent attempt to remove loyalty from the interplay of politics altogether by demanding that government be neutral and treat all citizens with equal respect, devoid of particular obligations.

I believe Perry’s characterization of Locke’s move toward abstraction (through principles of government neutrality and rights) as being a move away from and indeed fundamentally a denial of loyalty to be one-sided and anachronistic.  Rather, we might see this description of the division of spheres as also enabling and facilitating persons to be treated and to treat themselves and each other as part of a political unit, and therefore constituting specifically political loyalty.  Indeed, religious commitments cannot be protected without this background of an additional level of loyal commitment -- there would be too much uncertainty about the extent to which religious differences would tear apart common life.  Hence, abstraction is not empty of loyalty but constitutes a political form of it. 

Furthermore, the contention that Locke then believed that the division between spheres was an "easy" one to decipher and maintain in practice, and that all conflicts of jurisdiction were now resolved, seems false. Securing a legitimate and limited government, while a necessary condition for political loyalty, does not overcome all fundamental clashes. Perry might have more directly addressed the question Locke raises when there is a conflict over interpretation of rights -- "who shall be judge?" Here Locke does not characterize the conflict as one of a "taste in relish" but as being about fundamental issues, and Locke concludes that each side will do what it must and stand for its beliefs. This seems to me a very pointed acknowledgment of the continued reality of loyalty conflicts, which cannot be easily resolved by governmental neutrality.

A second aspect of Perry's book struck me: the apparent straightjacket of "liberal theory" and its failures. Perry's central proposition is that prevailing liberal theory is basically inadequate (unworkable, inaccurate, and normatively wrong) because it attempts to solve the problem of the clash of allegiances by dividing the normative world into bounded and separate spheres, thereby treating persons with abstract respect but failing to address the deep loyalties people will be moved by as citizens in a public political world. These loyalties should have a place because they tie into the core of how people identify and what they care about. For ethical and practical reasons, political principles should find new grounds to address these duties instead of aiming to abstract and rise above them, as liberal theory does.

My persistent query was who or what instantiated this highly stylized "liberal theory" which served as the culprit for our present theoretical failures and confusions. Many pat depictions of Johannine liberalism serve a useful foil but frequently do not ring true, and come to seem like straw-men by the end of the book. Perry describes the "genius" of the Johannine tradition (p. 6) as bringing together endless brilliant interlocutors through a consistent theme of finding the grounds on which religious-political conflicts can be justifiably sorted out. But for the most part, this tradition is depicted as rigidly "jurisdictional" and intent on leaving controversial subjects out of the conversation, denying the importance of difference and treating citizens as "mere persons" -- abstract holders of individual rights. The idea that group particularity and the commitments of religious believers have been erased from the public sphere of liberal societies, legal reasoning, and the tradition of toleration flies in the face of evidence. Certainly Locke did not desire the disappearance of religious witness from the public stage. And to accentuate Rawls' theory of justice as the apogee of liberal blindness provides a highly restricted reading of the point of the original position and veil of ignorance. In addition, while Perry acknowledges Rawls' later work in Political Liberalism, he does not seem to count this as part of the Johannine tradition. Nowhere does he directly explore the important concept of the overlapping consensus as a mode for acknowledging deep loyalties. Furthermore, Perry's treatment of abstraction as anti-loyalty or anti-duty-sensitive does not recognize that abstraction can be a practically and rhetorically powerful means of enabling persons -- individually or in groups -- to live a duty-bound life, whereas failing to step away and treat persons in generalizable terms would require converting people or insisting on the superiority of one set of beliefs. Describing abstraction as lack of attention ignores abstraction as a higher-level awareness, which will entail a different type of loyalty -- substantive commitments to the political body shared among diverse believers.

A third set of questions arises from Perry's focus on the "pretenses of loyalty." This phrase serves to trigger his extended critical diagnoses of liberalism and its complex origination in Locke's work. Perry makes a strong case for its historical importance to Locke's project. Locke sought to prevent the effectiveness of pretentious and intractable debate by establishing a strict division between legitimate spheres of normative claims, thereby disallowing spurious appeals enabled in the absence of such criteria: the result was the famous separate spheres theory grounding toleration. Using "pretense" as a lens for analyzing the character of political and religious claims and the quality of public discourse works very well for the historical reinterpretation of Locke, but also provides an excellent new angle on studying today's culture wars.

It is not clear, however, exactly what role the pretenses of loyalty plays in Perry’s critique of liberalism. He seems to have two main responses: (1) liberalism in fact allows pretenses to be brought back in because of its insistence on public reason; (2) liberalism should not be spooked by the threat of pretenses, but its vulnerability to such fears in part derives from a willful rejection of rhetoric and inattention to dialogue. Liberalism's insistence on public reason or an ideal speech situation woefully undertheorizes the nature of conversation in the public realm. Ironically, in attempting to prevent pretense then, liberal theory generates inauthentic argumentation. Disputants must hide their true, deep, sometimes "totalizing" loyalties. An example is the tendency of religious believers to use sociological arguments about harm to children, the family and so forth in order to deny gay marriage because of the need to dissemble: "The problem is that their real reasons for believing this are drawn from sources that some reasonable people doubt; hence they feel pressured to conceal their real reasons behind public reasons and couched in sociological studies" (p. 158). Liberalism betrays what it is meant to protect. The wrong done here is not the inauthenticity of public debate, but the forcing of falsehood and nonrecognition: "Such dishonesty deserves to be rooted out not because sincerity is the essence of true religion but for the more mundane reason that disingenuous claims of loyalty betray our fellow citizens whose lives are genuinely ordered by such allegiances" and "true loyalties . . . are worthy of public honor and protection" (p. 208). The question of the authenticity of reason-giving and the dynamics liberalism sets up in this regard pose intriguing questions, which Perry touches on in the conclusion, referencing other authors who've begun to work on these issues. This central theme offers an especially promising direction for liberal theory and for examining the nature of hostility in political normative confrontation.

With regard to liberalism's failure to offer a theory of rhetoric and discourse, I would also note the following about Perry's implicit assumptions. While he critiques liberalism for not recognizing loyalty dilemmas, he cannot rest with the conclusion that these tragic conflicts leave us with nothing to do but throw up our arms and say one side will win and the other (tragically) lose. And he does not do so. His recommendation is that more sophisticated theories of conversation, dialogue and rhetoric could help us. But for more genuine engagement with others' loyalties to be a positive political project, there must also be a willingness of the disputants to play by some set of rules of engagement, and that may depend on political loyalty. So any way we look at it, the importance of political loyalty remains. Attention to deeply divided religious loyalties is possible without fracturing or hardening of heart only against a background of a basic political commitment. Perry admits as much when he insists that those arguing for religion's role in politics do not desire a theocracy. Finally, a last question regarding loyalty. Perry asserts that he stands decisively for the turn back to loyalty. But does that mean all such or only some (and, then, which ones)? Perhaps critically diagnosing liberalism requires in tandem a critical diagnosis of loyalty and its varieties. Are all loyalties alike? Is the proper image of the type of conflict we face among ourselves and within ourselves in modern liberal societies on the order of Antigone or even Rawls' dilemma of whether he could have committed murder for the sake of a greater good? There are many clashes of obligation that conversation and dialogue cannot solve.

Many more comments and questions pop up in reading this lively, intensely argued, and excellent book. Perry is right that the proverbial pillars of liberalism's solution to the relation between religion and politics -- separation of church and state, treating persons as abstract individuals, and individual rights -- do not solve the dilemmas that emerge when persons are motivated by obligations tied to deep religious allegiances or "loyalties." Are we in a genuinely new and intractable situation? Is the intensity and acrimony of these public debates indicative of something wrong or off kilter, or just the most recent incarnation of a perpetual and inevitable tension? Is he right that "the recurring intellectual challenges to liberalism are signs of an incoherence that lies at the center of liberal political theory" (p. 21)? I think not. The resurgence of religious mobilization may be more a sign of fraying political loyalty brought on by economic dislocation, globalization, and other exogenous forces which liberal theory has not so far absorbed, and perhaps cannot.

The achievement of Perry's book comes less in its critical diagnosis of liberal theory (and this is certainly not new: who believes some liberal shangri-la can be brought about where conflicts are smoothly managed via governmental neutrality?), but much more in his reinterpretation of Locke, and finally and most distinctly, in the extent to which he brings into conversation a broad swath of writers who are grappling with the issue of liberal ideals and the demands of identity and religion. It achieves a synthesis, a new domain of interchange among writers who normally till their gardens in fenced off fields.