The Priority of Events: Deleuze's Logic of Sense

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Sean Bowden, The Priority of Events: Deleuze's Logic of Sense, Edinburgh University Press, 2011, 296pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748643646.

Reviewed by David Scott, Coppin State University


Sean Bowden's The Priority of Events: Deleuze's Logic of Sense is a timely and invaluable resource for resuscitating interest in a work that, despite the current renaissance in Deleuze studies, continues to perplex and discomfort those who seek a way into its unique and hybrid structure and conceptions. Bowden's strategy is not to propose an original philosophical argument; rather, with dogged rigor, he masterfully traces a single idea -- the ontological priority of the event -- through a series of figures and movements in Deleuze's Logic of Sense, and uses them as a thread to systematize the book's unique and sometimes paradoxical expression. Patiently, over the course of five chapters, Bowden surveys this primary theme, which he takes to be the fundamental problem directing The Logic of Sense. He interprets figures (Leibniz, Lautman, Simondon) and movements (Stoicism, structuralism, psychoanalysis), which sometimes float to the surface like confetti, only to suddenly disappear back into the weft and warp of Deleuze's inscrutable text. In some cases, even in Deleuze's own text, the relative significance of their ideas contradicts their actual, often oblique, presence in his enigmatic book. In this impressively thorough work, incorporating key untranslated sources, Bowden focuses on an aspect of Deleuze's thought that is more often than not neglected because of the idiosyncratic presentation and novel negotiation of metaphysics, ethics, literature, linguistics, and psychoanalysis in Logic of Sense. By constructing a coherent argument, which frames a coherent route for us to follow, Bowden provides a welcome gift to both the novice reader and the experienced scholar.

Bowden writes near the conclusion: "this present study can be considered to be a work in the history of philosophy" (278). Bowden's decision to write on Deleuze means that he must wade into the deep waters of the apparent irreconcilable divide between scholar and philosopher, protected on either side by those who have vested interests in this opposition -- disciplinary, institutional and, most certainly, political interests. Bowden handles this predicament with great poise. For Deleuze this problem -- that to do philosophy is either to create or to commentate -- is ultimately a false problem. But it is always present and accompanies his every interpretation of Spinoza or Nietzsche or Bergson, as it structures what he sees as the dominant "image of thought," which the history of philosophy contrives for self-justification: "an image of thought called philosophy has been formed historically and it effectively stops people from thinking" (Deleuze, Dialogues 13).

Thus, Deleuze's own work is constantly undercutting the division (that he himself insists on) between those texts that exemplify the history of philosophy (Spinoza, Nietzsche, or Bergson) and his more "properly philosophical" works like Difference and Repetition and Logic of Sense. "I like writers who seemed to be part of the history of philosophy, but who escaped from it in one respect or altogether" (Deleuze, Dialogues 14-5). The extent to which the thinkers and writers discussed in The Logic of Sense approach and exploit the underlying problem--either nourishing the creation of concepts or upsetting the sanctioned characterization of a philosopher's thought via a problematizing interpretation--determines the degree to which Deleuze's work is a philosophical success. Therefore, Bowden's decision to place the problem of the problem at the center of his interpretation of The Logic of Sense is meant to operationally and structurally orient us in Deleuze's thought. If there is one thing to critique in this vital work, it is that by omitting a discussion of phenomenology Bowden misses a significant opportunity to relate what he takes as essential in The Logic of Sense to the phenomenological conception of "transcendental ontology." It would be an overstatement, however, to suggest that this exclusion in any way compromises his overall purpose.

Bowden 's first chapter fills a gap in Deleuze studies. He identifies the Stoics as "the first philosophers to consider events as ontologically irreducible to 'things,' whether material or ideal" (17). He finds justification, therefore, for Deleuze's turn to Stoicism on the basis of the its distinction between "incorporeal events, meanings, or effects" and corporeal bodies, things, or abstract Ideas. More generally, Bowden helpfully outlines the ontological and epistemological principles of Stoic logic, physics, and ethics. He then narrows his focus to the Stoic ontological perspective that Deleuze adopts to conceptualize event-sense as the 'fourth dimension' of language. Bowden argues that Deleuze, consequently, justifies the Stoic perspective on the grounds that Stoic lekta or the "sayable," the incorporeal predicate-event, brings "language to bear upon itself." As a result, a dimension of temporality, Aion, is disclosed: "the infinite equivalence of an unlimited becoming" (Logic of Sense 3). Bowden helps us to see the grounds for Deleuze's finding in the Stoics the precursors to Nietzsche's 'eternal return' and Bergson's real durée. The question, however, is, How can language exploit the full expressive potential of sense? In other words, how can sense express more primarily real genesis, which secondarily determines the overt dimensions of the proposition: manifestation, signification, and denotation?

Bowden's analysis of Deleuze's Leibnizianism in Chapter Two is an important contribution. What motivates Deleuze's refashioning of Leibniz is, according to Bowden, the problem of understanding how events that are ontologically primitive in relation to 'things' are prolonged in the problem of how we are to acquire knowledge of things through grasping their events. Or rather, the problem of how Deleuze's fashioning a kind of "neo-Leibnizianism without God," by a "process of triangulation" -- a notion Bowden borrows from Donald Davidson -- establishes the relay between the distinct epistemological and ontological dimensions (logical genesis and ontological genesis) engendering events, simultaneously. In this chapter we get the true focus of Bowden's entire interpretation -- Deleuze's structural and operational foregrounding of the problem as problem in the "immanent double genesis of being and thought" (118). Bowden's refashioning of a Leibnizianism divorced from an original substantial instance (God) offers a way for Deleuze to theorize, in terms of a problem, a positive relation, no longer strictly exclusive or negative, between incompossible worlds. What this also means is that knowledge is reciprocally conditioned by the same ontological condition engendering being, insofar as knowledge or belief is determined by the knowing subject's triangulation of its objective being "within an inter-worldly 'problem'" – an intersubjective and linguistic milieu -- "which is 'resolved' by the way in which these operators take on particular, determinate values within the incompossible worlds forming the cases of solution to the problem" (71-2).

Bowden's third chapter, focused on Albert Lautman and Gilbert Simondon, two brilliant, if still largely neglected thinkers, is a major achievement. The relevance of Lautman and Simondon, according to Bowden, lies in how each contributes to Deleuze's development of the problem as the primary structural and operational element in The Logic of Sense. As Bowden writes, "Deleuze first introduces his concept of the 'problem' (and, as will be seen, his concept of 'singularity') in order to establish the conditions for this internal genesis" (101). The problem is the internalizing of genesis in sense, as genesis is the problematization of sense. He continues, "every designating proposition has a sense, but this sense will itself be located in a sub-representative problem in relation to which these propositions in turn function as elements of response or cases of solution" (101). Lautman and Simondon, though adopting distinct manners reflecting their divergent goals, share the idea that philosophical invention is nourished by a sub-representational problem. Lautman grasps the problem in a generalized mathematical "dialectic," composed by the dissymmetrical and 'differential' relation (dy/dx), whereas, for Simondon it is an ideal pre-individual field, a problematic, metastable system of maximal potentiality, engorged with incompatibilities. For both the individual 'thing' and Idea are but tenuously stabilized or individualized structures resulting from the resolving of the tensions internal to problematic fields. Thus, Bowden provides evidence that Deleuze's theory of intensive individuation builds upon the work of Lautman and Simondon by relating the problematic Idea to actual things via a necessity of an ideal problematic field, so that the knowledge embodied in propositional statements and objectively knowable things becomes mutually and reciprocally individuated through the same process without identity and without assuming a determining instance external to the system (102).

The final two chapters focus on the presence of structuralism and psychoanalysis in The Logic of Sense. In the chapter on structuralism, Bowden clarifies Jacques Lacan's tripartite distinction of the symbolic, imaginary, and real, while he carefully traces Deleuze's borrowing from Roman Jakobson's linguistics. Both discussions are tailored to Deleuze's ontological motive: to dramatize the internal genesis of the event via the actualization in language of an ideal but no less real 'pre-individual' ontological dimension of virtual singularities. Again, Bowden judiciously references Deleuze's Difference and Repetition, as well as the important essay, "How does one Recognize Structuralism?" If there is a quibble, it is that Bowden relies perhaps too heavily in the fourth chapter on Difference and Repetition. The unintentional result is that these ideas as developed in The Logic of Sense become marginalized.

Bowden's final chapter, concentrating on psychoanalysis, is in many ways his tour de force. Typically, one reads Deleuze's thought from the perspective of his later suspicion of psychoanalysis -- influenced by Felix Guattari. Certainly, one can suggest that the relative neglect of The Logic of Sense might stem from the unwillingness for many to see Deleuze's obvious attraction to psychoanalysis as anything other than a naïve misadventure or an aborted failure. Deleuze is, of course, partially to blame for this characterization. In either case, one does a disservice to the transformation undergone by psychoanalytic ideas and concepts that result from Deleuze's interpretation. Building upon his discussion of structuralism, Bowden argues that Deleuze's turn to psychoanalysis is necessitated by his desire to show how the genesis of the structure-problem "is thought by means of a structural account of the entry of the real, biological child into what Lacan calls the 'symbolic order', comprising all of the linguistic and cultural structures governing human existence" (185). His revealing how Deleuze brings together Lacan and Melanie Klein (two overtly mutually opposed positions), while demonstrating how Deleuze himself remained neither Lacanian nor Kleinian (or Freudian for that matter), is a great feat. Without fidelity to any one psychoanalytical doctrine, Deleuze, in Bowden's interpretation, invents an entirely new metaphysical-psychoanalytic "science of events" (186). Thus, psychoanalysis is taken to be the extension of the Stoic distinction between the incorporeal 'sayable' and corporeal 'things.' Bowden leaves us with the impression that Deleuze's later negative stance toward psychoanalysis is less a rejection of what it achieves than it is a rejection of the means by which it achieves its goals. It is an intriguing new perspective on Deleuze's relation to psychoanalysis.

Even so, a not always faint murmur of another conversation intrudes in this final chapter, as elsewhere. It is a conversation that, ironically, Bowden strengthens by his choosing to silence it.

On the first page of The Priority of Events Husserl specifically, but phenomenology more generally, is dismissed on the grounds that Bowden does not want to reduplicate other's efforts. Yet, how can one truly address the problem of sense, the ontology of events, without confronting Husserl, Heidegger, and Sartre, when Deleuze writes: "Could phenomenology be this rigorous science of surface effects" (Logic of Sense 21)? Or, how can one ignore Deleuze's crediting Husserl with rediscovering "the living sources of the Stoic inspiration" (20)? One notices how skillfully Bowden avoids the fact that the primary reference for Lautman is Heidegger, that Simondon's thought is clearly nourished by his teacher Merleau-Ponty,  and that Heidegger's 'ontological difference' structures Simondon's own ontological interrogations. How do we ignore that in The Logic of Sense Deleuze endorses Sartre's critique of Husserl? One does not have to be a phenomenologist or in agreement with its methods and goals to ask what I believe is fair a fair question: How might Bowden's evasion of phenomenology distort his intentions? In The Logic of Sense Deleuze certainly asks a related question of himself.

Bowden's marginalization of phenomenology is evident in relation to Deleuze's insistence that Husserl's formulation of "expression" (a central concept for Deleuze -- cf. Expressionism in Philosophy: Spinoza) extends the Stoic discovery of the 'fourth dimension of sense' -- "an incorporeal, complex, and irreducible entity, at the surface of things, a pure event which inheres or subsists in the proposition" (Logic of Sense 19). Specifically, Deleuze credits Husserl's formulation of the "perceptual noema" to Stoic inspiration (Logic of Sense 20). Like sense, the noema is neither reducible to the proposition nor 'lived' mental representation nor general concepts. Sense is the "neutral," "impassive," "sterile splendor" that, nonetheless, is the "genetic power" directing denotation, manifestation, and signification. So, if Bowden correctly notes Deleuze's exploiting of the distinction between Sinn and Bedeutung (sense and reference), he leaves out the fact that it is Husserl and not Frege who inspires Deleuze's reformulation of this distinction.

From Deleuze's perspective, Husserl's failure results from the fact that he cannot resolve the problem at the "heart of the logic of sense." Thus, it is a bit perplexing that Bowden ignores what Deleuze calls the problem of the "immaculate conception": how does genesis arise from the neutrality or sterility of sense itself? Phenomenology cannot resolve the problem, let alone ask the question, because it reduces genesis to intentional structures or ideal categories passively integrated a priori into a transcendental activity. This is why Deleuze continues an on-going dialogue with Ideas I, Husserl's text most exemplifying his 'transcendental turn,' which, for Deleuze intersects with the Stoic impulse "because of the reductive methods of phenomenology" (Logic of Sense 96). In Kantian terms, to be intelligible, whatever product genesis makes 'possible', is precisely the case because it is already predicated on the structures presumed by the transcendental activity of a subject. Thus, in the last analysis, the phenomenological transcendental subject renders genesis, for Husserl, impossible. For Deleuze Husserlian genesis merely traces the transcendental on the outlines of the empirical.

Quite explicitly, Deleuze provides a critique of Husserl's "sleight-of-hand" change from a static categorical phenomenology to one supposedly more dynamically constitutive of reality. Deleuze insists on the absolute non-resemblance between what conditions (metastable, pre-individual plane of singularities) and what is conditioned (actualized or the individuated 'thing'). Only then do "the conditions of the true genesis become apparent," Deleuze writes (Logic of Sense 105). Without addressing this issue, Deleuze's borrowings from Simondon, Lautman and structuralism remain untethered. Because of Bowden's decision to completely sidestep Deleuze's overt negotiations with phenomenology, his otherwise sophisticated commentary suggests a pedagogical narrowness. If, the omission of phenomenology strengthens Bowden's focus on the ontological priority of the event over substantial ontologies via the genealogy of figures and movements Deleuze outlines, it also incompletely articulates the problem of the sense-event as Deleuze formulates it. We have lost any idea of whom Deleuze takes to be his primary adversary, against whom he stakes out his position.

This worry is most clearly manifested in Bowden's description of Deleuze's ontological prioritizing of events as offering a "transcendental ontology." For Bowden Deleuze's transcendental ontology defines events that "are ontologically prior to substances, 'all the way down'" (82). But Bowden provides a second definition: it is that the priority of events over worldly individuals means that the world of events "is not something external to the conditions of knowledge" (69).

Immediately we are reminded that more than any other philosopher, Heidegger's path-breaking reinterpretation of Kant's transcendentalism sets the stage for Bowden's reference to transcendental ontology. In Heideggerian terms, the "transcendental" does not refer to a priori knowledge or the possibility of synthetic knowledge, but rather to the possibility itself for comprehending the ontological constitution of beings. Ontological knowledge "says something about the intrinsic dynamics of beings" (Heidegger, Phenomenological Interpretation of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason 65) and thereby expands the possibility of knowledge beyond merely logical possibilities. Thus, the ontological truth it grants thought is primordial, Heidegger argues, insofar as it discloses in advance what is essential about the being of beings. "Transcendental knowledge is knowledge which investigates the possibility of an understanding of being, a pre-ontological understanding of being; and such an investigation is the task of ontology. Transcendental knowledge is ontological knowledge, i.e., a priori knowledge of the ontological constitution of beings. Because transcendental knowledge is ontological knowledge, Kant can equate transcendental philosophy with ontology" (Heidegger, Phenomenological Interpretation of Kant 127, my italics).

In fact, the richness and thoroughness of The Priority of Events, ironically, causes one to feel more intensely the absence of phenomenology and to wonder if the rigorous clarification and exposition carried out by Bowden might not have been fuller with some level of engagement of it, however indirect. Instead, we are left with a vague distortion, a kind of astigmatism on the surface of Bowden's presentation, where its absence is discernible.

Bowden's reticence to identify the phenomenological origins of his characterization of Deleuze's transcendental ontology, means that he omits what is at stake in Simondon's formulation: the individuation of knowledge requires a new conception of the subject, or a new transcendental perspective for subjectivity, on consciousness, that is expressive of this immanent double genesis of being and thought. Consequently, Deleuze does not conserve the form of consciousness within the transcendental, so much as try to replace the a priori unity of synthesis and identity of an individuated consciousness-Ego with an impersonal, pre-individual, problematic transcendental field -- which in his last published work is "defined by pure immediate consciousness with neither object nor self, as a movement which neither begins nor ends" and is constituted by singularities or potentials in a process of auto-unification (Deleuze, "Immanence: A Life").

Despite the refusal to acknowledge the phenomenological roots of his own interpretation, Bowden's greatest appeal is that he courageously faces head-on the unique challenge of commenting on Deleuze. As he writes, "if we are to remain faithful [to] the Deleuzian event, there is no choice for the future but to go beyond Deleuze" (278). Should the question be: has Bowden been too faithful to Deleuze's thought? In truth, this is a question that is only answerable in the future (as all good questions should be). What we can admit, however, is that we are grateful to Bowden for the opportunity to ponder this useful question. And for the future, we are left inspired by same truth he admits: that ultimately philosophical success is engendered in the necessary failures that guide the history of philosophy.