The Problem of Universals in Contemporary Philosophy

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Gabriele Galluzzo and Michael J. Loux (eds.), The Problem of Universals in Contemporary Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 229pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107100893.

Reviewed by Nikk Effingham, University of Birmingham


This is a collection of papers on the ontology of properties, universals, tropes, etc. All of the papers are focussed on these purely ontological matters, with no crossover into other areas. Not that this is a complaint -- all too often attempts at innovation are sourced in such impurity, shoehorning discussions about a round philosophical matter into the square hole of another. It's good, then, to see that the collection has a clear, straightforward aim at the outset which it then delivers on.

There are nine papers, plus an introduction by the editors. Michael J. Loux and Peter van Inwagen write on constituent ontologies: that properties are 'constituents' of other things and that the world is somehow 'built up' out of these entities. Loux gives a paper in favour; van Inwagen delivers his anti-constituent 'relationist' line (although, be aware, the paper is substantially similar to an earlier piece [van Inwagen 2011] -- I hope no-one is offended if I point out that it even contains the same typo [2011: 394; 2015: 55]). This theme is also discussed elsewhere in the collection (e.g. by Heil [120-21].)

There is then a paper by the, much missed, E. J. Lowe on substantial universals and the four category ontology. Gabriele Galluzzo's contribution is in similar territory, giving an excellent piece on an Aristotelian understanding of properties and kinds. There is also a paper by Fraser MacBride responding to Cian Dorr's paper against there being nonsymmetric relations [Dorr 2004]. All these papers are an excellent addition to the literature, although for the rest of this review I will focus on the remaining papers.

John Heil's paper discusses 'particularised properties', giving an extensive argument in favour of their existence (opting to see them as 'modes' as opposed to 'tropes'). He rallies against the idea that there could be 'comme il faut philosophy' i.e. that we might fall prey to acquiescing complaints on the grounds that popular philosophical opinion weighs against them. Heil says: "In philosophy, everything is up for grabs; there are no default views, no heavyweight champs." [155]

This sentiment -- which I obviously agree with -- brought nothing but a smile to my lips. And here Heil weighs in against the opinion that particularised properties are somehow incoherent. It's an interesting essay, drawing subtle distinctions between 'modes' and 'tropes' and ultimately leaving us with two different ways of understanding particularised properties. To believe in tropes is to believe in an ontology of particularised properties where other things (e.g. material objects) are built out of the tropes; to believe in modes is to believe in an ontology of (e.g.) material objects out of which the modes are abstracted. Given an ontology of tropes, objects depend upon particularised properties; given a mode ontology the reverse is true. Heil opts for the latter.

It's interesting stuff, but some bits of the scheme throw me. Universals could exist, says Heil, as nothing over and above the particularised properties -- they would be no 'addition in being'. But if the modes aren't fundamental themselves, and objects are fundamental, then modes are no addition in being either. So they are on a par with the universals that fail to add to being. I don't think this was the conclusion that Heil was going for. Presumably some subtle distinction is called for between being non-fundamental (and grounded in an entity or entities) and being derived by a process of abstraction from some entity (or entities); given such a distinction, modes could be abstracted from objects without being metaphysically derivative in the way that universals end up being. Subtle distinctions like this have been drawn elsewhere [Barnes 2012] and I wonder if this is what Heil would opt for (or, of course, whether I've missed something).

Such issues of unique interest to metaphysicians -- namely those concerning the relations of ontological dependence, grounding, reduction, abstraction, etc. -- also bear on Anna-Sofia Maurin's paper. Maurin argues that states of affairs won't help solve the relation regress. States of affairs can't be reducible to simply the relevant particular and the property it instantiates -- that much we know from D. M. Armstrong, who points out that you can have both without having the relevant state of affairs. And if we want to avoid the relation regress, we know that we can't reduce it to the relevant particular, relevant property, and some unifier (or infinite chain of unifiers) -- avoiding exactly that situation is just what it is to have avoided the relation regress. That said, Maurin says states of affairs must be either irreducible and ontologically complex or irreducible and ontologically simple. They can't be simple because

if what exists are ontologically simple -- 'blobby' -- states of affairs, and if states of affairs are (as Armstrong would take them to be) concrete particulars, then, on this suggestion, the world is a world of simple concrete particulars. Bad news indeed for anyone who thinks there are properties. [200]

But it's less clear to me that this is true. Maybe the world is fundamentally one of blobby states of affairs, but there can still be properties. Whilst they'll be derivative entities I don't see why that's a problem. Indeed, Armstrong already says that only states of affairs are fundamental, and the universals/particulars that are their constituents are not [2010: 27].

That's not to say Maurin's worries are somehow obviously misguided, just that there is more to be said. For instance, permissivists like Jonathan Schaffer [2009] would have a field day as the only worthwhile project is, given permissivism, the project of determining what fundamentally exists -- a conclusion clearly allied to Maurin's. None of this is a slight against Maurin's article (which then goes on to discuss ever more interesting ways of dealing with the regress problem).

Robert K. Garcia's paper also focusses on subtle distinctions, this time one made in the earlier paper by Loux. The distinction is between tropes that self-characterise and tropes that don't. Consider a trope of being charged. Given the former understanding of tropes -- what Garcia calls 'modular tropes' -- that trope would, itself, be charged. Given the latter understanding -- what Garcia calls 'modifier tropes' -- the trope is not charged (and only serves to characterise the charged entity). Garcia then considers two arguments often put forward in favour of tropes: one argues that tropes serve better than substrata (and hence should be preferred) and the other argues that tropes serve well in helping construct property classes (and hence should be preferred). In both cases, says Garcia, when we nail down whether we have modular or modifier tropes in mind we see that we have unknowingly oscillated between the two understandings, causing problems for those arguments.

The distinction is nice, although I get lost in some of the details of Garcia's discussion. For instance, Garcia claims that substrata play two roles which tropes are intended to take over: (i) explaining why the object is non-repeatable and (ii) being the subject that is characterised by properties. Only modifier tropes play the first role, says Garcia, and modular tropes appear to play the second. I have a hard time understanding the argument for the former claim [145-48] although the argument for the latter claim was more straightforward: at least something is charactered; if that charactered thing isn't the bare substrata then it must be the trope; if the trope is charactered then the trope is some such way i.e. it's a module trope rather than a modifier trope. (And, presumably, if we say instead that it is the bundle of tropes which is charactered, rather than the individual tropes themselves, that's dialectically poor as a substrata lover would never cave on that point in the first place lest she think that a bundle of universals could be charactered -- which would, again, obviate substrata.) All in all it is an interesting paper on an interesting division that deserves further attention.

I have more to say about this collection other than drawing attention to the interesting, subtle distinctions discussed within. Sophie Gibbs's paper discusses, at length, a battery of arguments from Peter Forrest and Armstrong for the conclusion that universals, not tropes, make for a satisfying metaphysical theory of laws -- in particular, explaining why the laws apply in generality. (Heil [122-3] and Lowe [79-84] also discuss this line of thought.).

Given universals the explanation for the generality of laws is meant to be straightforward: an instantiation of Fness causes there to be an instantiation of Gness (in virtue of some facts about, or features of, Fness); as Fness is a universal, and every instantiation of Fness is numerically the same, every instantiation of Fness will therefore bring about an instantiation of Gness (and the generality of the law corresponding to that connection between Fness and Gness is explained). Given tropes the answer is meant to be problematic: a particularised property, F1ness, causes there to be another particularised property, G1ness (in virtue of some facts about, or features of, F1ness); as F1ness is distinct from other such instances (F2ness, F3ness, etc.) what, then, explains why all those instances also bring about relevant instances (i.e. G2ness, G3ness, etc.). Given universals we need only the principle that numerically identical things cause the same thing; given tropes we need the further principle that exactly resembling things cause the same things (which, Forrest worries, is unreasonable).

Gibbs takes up the cause of defending tropes from this attack. Her specifics vary upon whether or not categoricalism or dispositionalism are true. Given the latter, we should think like does cause like. Given the former we shouldn't, but then there's also no reason to think that universals, in virtue of their being numerically identical across instantiations, need have the same causal powers. It's a convincing defence and an interesting paper.

Cheekily, I'm going to add my own observations on the matter (although they only serve to bolster Gibbs's overall point!). Are these things -- universals or tropes -- in spacetime or not? If they're not, what business do we have in thinking that they cause anything -- causally efficacy is the province of the spatiotemporally located, not the timeless riff raff.

If, alternatively, they are in spacetime then even universals won't help as they are normally thought of as being multi-located. Multi-located entities are weird. If a time traveller multi-locates and stands next to himself then there's no reason to think that his being 6' tall necessitates that his other multi-located version need also be 6' tall, e.g. if he stands next to his eight year old self, his other version might be 4' tall. Similar thoughts apply to multi-located universals. Just because one instance of a universal has some properties (e.g. the intrinsic property of bringing about Gness instantiations) doesn't mean that all instances do even when they're numerically identical instances -- they are like our imaginary time traveller who can have different properties at the same time.

And don't think that located tropes will do any better than universals just because they're singularly located. If tropes are located in spacetime they're presumably located where their instances are. So a charged metal chair and a charged metal table both have charged tropes, and one trope would be chair shaped and the other table shaped. Now they don't exactly resemble one another and if they don't exactly resemble one another than adding in that like causes like doesn't help explain why each particularised property of one type routinely causes there to be tropes of another type.

Ultimately this line of argument will shore up Gibbs's position that the generality of laws doesn't favour preferring universals, but I hope is an interesting thought to think about.

All in all this edited collection is excellent and a 'must buy' for anyone seriously dedicated to the ontology of properties. I dare say a library missing it will come to regret it.


Armstrong, D. 2010. Sketch for a Systematic Metaphysics, Oxford University Press.

Barnes, E. 2012. Emergence and Fundamentality, Mind 121, 873-901.

Dorr, C. 2004. Non-Symmetric Relations, Oxford Studies in Metaphysics 1, 155-92.

Schaffer, J. 2009. On What Grounds What, in Manley, Chalmers, and Wassermann (eds.) Metametaphysics: New Essays on the Foundations of Ontology, Oxford University Press.

Van Inwagen, P. 2011. Relational vs. Constituent Ontologies, Philosophical Perspectives 25, 389-405.