The Pursuit of Unhappiness: The Elusive Psychology of Well-Being

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Daniel M. Haybron, The Pursuit of Unhappiness: The Elusive Psychology of Well-Being, Oxford UP, 2008, 357pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199545988.

Reviewed by Neera Badhwar, University of Oklahoma



“There are many good reasons not to write a book on happiness,” says Daniel Haybron in the Preface to his book. It quickly becomes obvious to the reader, however, that there are many good reasons to read it. There has recently been a spate of books and articles on well-being, the good life, and happiness understood as well-being, that which benefits a person. Haybron’s book is the first book-length philosophical treatment of happiness understood as a psychological condition rather than as well-being. This in itself is a significant accomplishment. But the book is also an original and thorough investigation, richly informed by empirical psychology, of almost every topic connected, or seen as connected, with happiness: the self, well-being and virtue, and the good society. It is written in an engaging, often humorous, sometimes poetic, style, and contains a wealth of illustrations from life, literature, film, science, the arts, the news media, and Haybron’s own prodigious imagination. Because the topic is so new, and the phenomenology of happiness so elusive, Haybron uses what he calls “an elaborate form of ostension, pointing to the phenomenon without fully elucidating it” (42). He engages with both the latest science and ancient philosophy in elucidating the nature of happiness. Haybron’s grasp of the relevant literatures is nothing short of astonishing. The scope of the book may be gleaned from the following overview.

Part I: Fundamentals of Prudential Psychology sets out the plan of the book and explains Haybron’s two central contentions: happiness in the long-term psychological sense is an emotional state, and the Enlightenment assumption of Personal Authority is False, as seen by the common failure to achieve happiness (this explains the title of the book). It also introduces us to the conceptual distinctions between happiness and well-being and well-being and the good life, and provides the desiderata for a satisfactory theory of happiness. The best theory of happiness will be the one that is most faithful to our ordinary ways of speaking and thinking (descriptive adequacy or intuitive plausibility) and consistent with the importance we place on it (practical utility). Under the latter Haybron identifies four functions that the idea of happiness performs in everyday thought: deliberating about decisions, evaluating how well we or others are doing in their personal lives, predicting people’s behavior, and explaining their behavior. Haybron calls his method “reconstructive analysis” because it reconstructs our ordinary notion of happiness instead of just describing it, as in conceptual analysis. Haybron’s method overlaps significantly with L. W. Sumner’s method in his Welfare, Happiness, and Ethics. Thus, both require that the theories they come up with be intuitively plausible and that they be consistent with their role in our practical deliberations and psychological explanations of people’s behavior. But whereas Haybron subsumes the last two requirements under practical utility, Sumner subsumes them under descriptive adequacy. The important difference is that whereas Sumner applies this rich methodology to well-being, Haybron applies it to happiness.

Part II: The Nature of Happiness makes the case for Haybron’s own emotional state theory of happiness as psychic affirmation and the case against the hedonistic and the life-satisfaction theories of happiness.

Part III: The Nature of Well-Being presents the argument for a non-subjectivist conception of well-being as nature-fulfillment against both Aristotelian perfectionism and the value subjectivism of informed desire satisfaction and life satisfaction accounts.

Part IV: Pursuing Happiness argues that we are neither very good judges of our own happiness, nor very good at pursuing happiness, and concludes with Haybron’s thoughts on the good society. His own personal utopia is the unnamed island, depicted on the cover of the book, where he spent many summers with his family in the 1970s and 80s. He uses it in several places in the book to illustrate certain features of one kind of good society.

The lengthy first chapter provides a detailed introduction to the book, and all the chapters thereafter end with a summary of the argument or a statement of the main conclusion or the implications of the arguments. This enables time-challenged readers to get a sense of what to expect before plunging into the book. My review will focus on Haybron‘s most original positive contribution: his theory of happiness. But I will also comment on his conception of well-being.

As noted above, Haybron’s topic is happiness in the long-term psychological sense. Happiness is a favorable emotional response to one’s life; in more colorful terms, it is a psychic affirmation of one’s life (111). But such a response can be made even by the brainwashed, or by someone on the experience machine. What is truly valuable is happiness that fulfills one’s emotional nature. Such authentic happiness, as Haybron (borrowing the concept, with some modifications, from Sumner), calls it, is an essential, important part of self-fulfillment (22). In turn, self-fulfillment is an important part of well-being and well-being is an essential part of the good life. To put it all together: the good life well-being self-fulfillment fulfillment of emotional self = authentic happiness.

In defending the nature-fulfillment or self-fulfillment view, Haybron harks back to the eudaimonist view. His is a very modern eudaimonism, however, for unlike traditional eudaimonism, the nature or self whose fulfillment concerns Haybron is not the generic human self, but rather, the human self in all its individuality.

The psychological states that constitute happiness, according to Haybron, are positive moods and emotions, and mood-propensities to have these moods and emotions, specifically, “states of attunement (e.g., tranquility), engagement (e.g., vitality, flow), and endorsement (e.g., joy)” (1). In Ch. 6, these states are discussed at length in terms of their specific affects and linked with, respectively, the Stoic, the Aristotelian and Dionysian, and the Democritean traditions. The affects that constitute these three states are central to who we are, in the sense that they “get to us,” they touch our souls. The most important manifestation of this centrality is that they dispose us to experience other similar affects (Ch. 7). For example, when we are in a tranquil mood, the world seems peaceful and we tend not to be easily ruffled. Peripheral affects like pleasure, annoyance, amusement, and the like flit through consciousness without altering our dispositions. Other distinguishing characteristics of central affects include productivity, persistence, pervasiveness, and profundity (130-33). Our language reflects the distinction between central and peripheral affects, as when we talk about uplifting joy but not uplifting pleasure, and serene personalities, but not pleased or annoyed personalities.

Haybron’s analysis of happiness into the three states of attunement, engagement, and endorsement, and his distinction between central and peripheral affects, strikes the reader as at once highly original — and as obviously true. Original, because no one has made quite this analysis of happiness, or quite this distinction between central and peripheral, before; obvious, because once we read this analysis and this distinction, it rings true to experience. (One might wonder about some of the details, though. For example, why is joy classified as a form of endorsement (the feeling that one’s life is good) rather than as a form of engagement, and why can’t annoyance be a personality trait, given the existence of people who seem perpetually annoyed? But these problems, if they are problems, are peripheral.)

Equally important — and obvious when pointed out — is Haybron’s view that happiness is not exhausted by our conscious emotional states. We may feel perfectly happy most of the time, but if we have a propensity to be easily irritated, depressed, stressed-out, and so on, we are not really very happy (136-38). For example, Tom is cheerful most of the time, enjoying his vacation with his old friend, Jerry, after his divorce. But twice he bursts into tears, apparently for no reason at all. In psychoanalytic terms, he seems to be suffering from distress that becomes conscious only occasionally, and that explains his propensity to feel distress.

Haybron rejects both of the dominant theories of happiness in the philosophical and psychological literature: the hedonistic and the life-satisfaction theories. Hedonism, he argues, whether internalist, externalist, or attitudinal, invites multiple counterexamples, and simply cannot do the job that happiness does in explaining or predicting behavior. Thus, for example, it is possible to have lots of pleasure and still be unfulfilled, or even in emotional pain. The phenomenon of hedonic inversion also shows that some painful experiences, e.g., sadness, fear, or anxiety, such as in response to a work of fiction, can be happiness-constituting. Some pleasures, such as the pleasure of eating crackers, or of an intense orgasm with a stranger, are irrelevant to happiness because they are far too shallow: even a whole series of them over time need not go deep enough to have an impact on our emotional natures (63-64). But even when they do, it is not they that constitute our happiness but, rather, the positive moods and dispositions they result in.

This leaves it open that deep pleasures, or important pleasures like those of tranquility, could be happiness-constituting (65). Haybron argues, however, that even these will not do because they are mere experiences, whereas happiness consists of enduring moods, emotions, and mood-propensities with predictive and explanatory power (67-69). Experiences happen to a person, whereas happiness is a state of a person that, in part, determines the kinds of experiences she will have (69). Happiness has “deep, far-reaching, and typically lasting consequences for a person’s state of mind and behavior,” whereas pleasure lacks this causal depth. This is the basic problem with hedonism.

Haybron’s arguments are convincing, although some of them seem unnecessary. He starts by saying that even intense bodily pleasures cannot be constitutive of happiness because they are too shallow to have an impact on our emotional condition. This suggests that if they were deep enough to have an impact on our emotional condition, they would be constitutive of happiness. The same suggestion is present in the discussion of deep or important pleasures like tranquility. But then it turns out that even if the pleasures of orgasms or tranquility have an impact on our emotional condition, they are, at best, only causes of happiness, because pleasures are mere experiences, not enduring moods or mood-propensities. In that case, however, the discussion of the putative shallowness of orgasmic pleasures is irrelevant to Haybron’s point. It suffices to say that, as experiences, they are the wrong sort of animal.

Can happiness be identified with life-satisfaction, that is, the state of being pleased that one’s life is going well by one’s standards (82-83)? Haybron’s discussion of this issue is too complex and dense to be summarized easily, but in bare outline, his position is that (i) our evaluations of our lives can diverge significantly from our affective state (think of the tortured artist who is, nevertheless, satisfied with her life); (ii) few people have robust and well-grounded attitudes towards their lives, whereas everyone has some degree of happiness or unhappiness; what most people have, rather, are unstable, context-influenced, judgments; (iii) life satisfaction judgments are often influenced by norms, such as those of gratitude, that cause them to be unreflective of how well our lives are going for us, whereas happiness is so reflective (80). For all these reasons, life satisfaction cannot be equated with happiness.

Haybron’s arguments for the instability of life satisfaction judgments and their possible divergence from our emotional states are supported by an impressive range of empirical data. His view explains why life-satisfaction survey results often correlate only weakly with positive affect and strongly with negative affect. No discussion of life satisfaction can afford to ignore Haybron‘s analysis. In addition, his insightful and thought-provoking defense of the thesis that which perspective or norm we adopt in evaluating our lives is often rationally underdetermined raises intriguing questions about the rational underdetermination of our evaluations in other realms as well: relationships, moral character, novels, and so on.

Along the way Haybron addresses various other issues about happiness: How happy is happy (not, as often thought, simply being happy more than 50% of the time)? How do we measure happiness (not, as commonly thought, by asking people if they are satisfied with their lives)? Why are we bad at recognizing how happy we are (because un/happiness is not entirely a matter of conscious affects and may involve no occurrent states).

In Part III, Haybron turns his attention to the nature of well-being, defending a self-fulfillment conception of well-being against both the Aristotelian perfectionist conception and the subjectivist desire-satisfaction and life-satisfaction conceptions. The importance of happiness in our lives, he argues, cannot be explained by subjectivist accounts of well-being (Ch. 9); the best explanation of the importance of happiness is that it has “intrinsic prudential value as an aspect of self-fulfillment,” and thus of well-being, because our propensities for happiness are a part of who we are, of our identity as individuals (178-180). Haybron gives two extended examples that convincingly make this point (and that also show that happiness cannot be identified with either informed desire satisfaction or life satisfaction). Henry prefers being a farmer, an occupation he deems worthy or noble, to following his passion by “going into business with a model railroading shop” (179). He knows that he’ll be happier doing the latter, but he does not value his happiness very highly. Claudia prefers her wealth and social status as an attorney to leading a life with less stress and anxiety and more happiness (180). Both feel unfulfilled as a result of their “self-imposed bondage,” even though their bondage satisfies their ideals and informed desires. Even if they don’t realize it, they are living in ways that don’t suit their emotional natures, and would be better off — have greater well-being — if they were doing something else. They are mistaken in de-valuing happiness, because by so doing they devalue their self-fulfillment and well-being.

Haybron’s view of authentic happiness as emotional nature-fulfillment, though rich and plausible, raises a puzzle, for it seems that some people, e.g., naturally depressed people, are unhappy precisely because they live in ways that suit their nature (indulging their depression, living in a depressing environment, seeking the company only of depressing people, and so on). Their happiness requires them to change their nature by doing things that are contrary to their nature, e.g., seeking therapy and drugs to overcome their depression. Some of them, however, Haybron notes, have “uplift anxiety” when they take antidepressants, and therefore stop taking them (183). It looks like Haybron needs to add a qualifier to his conception of happiness: happiness lies in emotional nature-fulfillment so long as your nature does not rule out the very possibility of happiness. But perhaps this type of qualification is unavoidable for any theory of happiness or well-being.

As noted above, Haybron calls his self-fulfillment conception of well-being eudaimonistic. But since the self at issue is the idiosyncratic individual self, not the moralized self of traditional eudaimonistic theories, what makes us happy on his theory may well be something quite immoral. Haybron gives some of the best arguments I know against the Aristotelian view that perfection — whether understood as virtue or as actualization of one’s powers – is a fundamental or intrinsic (rather than derivative or instrumental) component of well-being, and that the greater one’s perfection, the greater one’s well-being (Ch. 8). (I have argued elsewhere that the latter view does not follow from the former, and that many passages in the Nicomachean Ethics contradict it. Nevertheless, many Aristotelians have held the view, so it is worth considering.) Haybron thinks that the perfectionist theory of well-being confuses the notion of well-being with the notion of the good life because it starts with the question: what is the ideal life for me? This question ineluctably leads to the answer: a life that is good everything considered, that is, a life of virtue, actualization, and well-being. But it makes perfect sense to take a narrower perspective and ask: what does my well-being consist of? Perfection may well contribute to well-being by contributing to the richness of a life, but this does not make it an intrinsic part of well-being.

Further, some virtue or actualization is compatible with a great deal of immorality and greater virtue or actualization is compatible with less happiness. Haybron’s arguments here proceed by way of counterexamples meant to appeal to our intuitions. The first concerns a Southern slave-holder convinced of his righteousness and surrounded by loving and admiring friends and family. How, Haybron asks, is this slave-holder any worse off personally than his anti-slavery counterpart in the same position (159)? The most the perfectionist can say in reply is: "Given that the slave-holder cares about righteousness, if he knew that what he was doing was unjust, he would be unhappy. His happiness is based partly on ignorance about the nature of his own actions, and to that extent is not a response to his life. And you yourself, Haybron, hold that authentic happiness must be a response to the facts of one’s life (189-90)." But this argument does not take the perfectionist all the way because it does not apply to people whose concern with living righteously is entirely instrumental or limited to their near and dear.

Haybron’s extended example of Angela, a career diplomat, poses a challenge to the perfectionist who holds that the more virtuous one’s life, the more well-being one must have. On the verge of a well-deserved and much-desired retirement, Angela is asked to take on an important assignment for which she is better qualified than anyone else (161-63). She does so, not because she would regret it if she didn’t, but just because she can see that she is needed. By taking on the assignment, she achieves greater perfection but less well-being: less happiness, less pleasure, less fun. No doubt the convinced perfectionist will disagree, insisting that her greater perfection makes up for the less happiness, pleasure, and fun. But (Haybron could ask), if Angela could have chosen the situation with a view to her well-being, would she not have chosen that the need for her expertise had never arisen so that she could have retired?

There is only one important place in the book that Haybron loses me. As noted above, Haybron borrows the idea of authenticity, with some modifications, from Sumner. For both, authentic happiness is an autonomous and informed favorable response to the facts of one’s life. But Haybron thinks that the idea of authenticity is in tension with Sumner’s subjectivist life satisfaction conception of well-being, in part because it implies an objective notion of the self (190-91). He argues that the authenticity constraint is not a problem for his own self-fulfillment theory of well-being, because self-fulfillment “is objective to begin with, and rests on the sort of objective account of the self that we need” (191).

Presumably, self-fulfillment is objective in the sense that emotional nature fufillment (authentic happiness) is a major component of well-being, and thus a prudential value, regardless of the individual’s attitude towards it. In this sense, however, authentic happiness is an objective value for Sumner as well, even though he does not acknowledge it explicitly, since authentic happiness just is well-being on his view. Further, on Sumner’s view, as on Haybron’s, if the individual’s way of life made her unhappy, she would be unhappy regardless of her endorsement of her values; the individual’s endorsement cannot override the affective component of her well-beng. Consider, for example, a Genghis Khan who endorses slaughtering adversaries, but is made despondent by such slaughter. Sumner’s conception of authentic happiness is subjective only in the sense that there are no moral, perfectionist, or aesthetic constraints on the individual’s values — or on her affective response to her life. And in this sense, Haybron’s conception of authentic happiness is subjective as well: a Genghis Khan who delights in rape and slaughter is as authentically happy as, say, Henry David Thoreau who delights in the company of children. Perhaps Sumner’s view makes the individual sovereign over her well-being in ways that Haybron’s does not. Regardless of this, both Haybron and Sumner encounter trouble in their insistence that authenticity is required as a condition of the individual’s favorable response to her life being really her response to her life. The autonomy condition of authenticity is problematic because, in a perfectly straightforward sense, the favorable response of a thoroughly heteronomous individual is every bit her response as that of an autonomous individual. The epistemic condition of authenticity is problematic for similar reasons. If someone’s reflective judgment (Sumner) or emotional nature (Haybron) dictates that she is better off remaining ignorant about, or rationalizing, big chunks of her life, her favorable response to her life is every bit her response to her life (the life of a prudently ignorant or self-deceived individual) as the life of a well-informed or reality-oriented individual.

It seems that, like Sumner, Haybron cannot bring himself to say that a badly deceived, heteronomous individual can be authentically happy because it conflicts with our picture of a normal, healthy human being. As he himself puts it, the individual must be functioning properly, and must lead a life “with all the richness of an ordinary human life,” to be genuinely emotionally fulfilled (186). But what is an “ordinary human life” if not a normal, healthy life? A judgment of proper functioning also requires appeal to the notion of a normal, healthy self, the very human self that Haybron has been at pains to reject in earlier chapters. And if Haybron needs to appeal to the idea of a normal, healthy human self after all, then, like Sumner, he has left a door open for perfectionism about well-being to make a comeback.

There is much else in this rich and complex book that I do not have space to discuss, especially the Part IV discussion of (un)happiness in contemporary liberal societies, and of liberal optimism, which Haybron regards as unfounded. But a careful attention to what he has to say here, as elsewhere, is of the first importance not only for philosophers, but for everyone interested in a deeper understanding of themselves, their society, and the nature of happiness. It is safe to say that, after this book, happiness will never be the same again.