The Quest for Meaning: Friends of Wisdom from Plato to Levinas

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Adriaan T. Peperzak, The Quest for Meaning: Friends of Wisdom from Plato to Levinas, Fordham University Press, 2003, 282pp, $26.00 (pbk), ISBN 0823222780.

Reviewed by Angelica Nuzzo, Brooklyn College, CUNY


This volume brings together a collection of Peperzak's essays (most of them appeared already between 1984 and 2000) organized around two connected themes so as to form the unitary narrative of a book. On the one hand, the discussion regards the relationship of philosophical discourse and faith (in particular Christian faith); while on the other hand, Peperzak explores a constellation of historical figures -- ranging from Plato and Plotinus to Anselm and Bonaventure, from Leibniz and Pascal to Hegel and Levinas -- finding in them paradigmatic examples of the convergence between philosophy, history, and faith (faith, this time, understood in the broader sense of an inner affective motivation that drives philosophical thinking as such, faith in the basic sense of "trust" (19)). The main thesis of the volume regards the idea of philosophy, which Peperzak presents as an activity fundamentally shaped by a historically conditioned and individualized yet somehow universal human experience (and faith). His claim is both historic and systematic. Historically, Peperzak follows the continuity of such an idea of philosophy in its variations in the ancient Greek world, in medieval philosophy and theology, and in post-modern times. He sees by contrast "modernity as an experiment that interrupted the long-standing tradition of contemplation" (3) dominating the pre-modern history of philosophy. Such experiment was based on the idea of reason's "autonomy" and philosophy's "autarchy" -- a view that, on Peperzak's account, has driven philosophy dangerously away from lived experience and more broadly even from "spirituality" (19-20). From this historic assessment the systematic thesis of the volume and the present task of philosophy follow: "we must retrieve the pre-modern tradition in a transformative way, without, however, losing the discoveries of modernity and postmodernity" (3). Thus, in this book, we find a magisterial attempt at "actualizing" crucial figures of the history of philosophy in light of a very strong idea of philosophy conceived as rational practice informed by history and life. The question that this book attempts to answer is nothing less than what philosophy is. The more particular angle from which this question is addressed is the relation of philosophical thinking, faith, and religion.

In the dialogue that Peperzak offers in lieu of an introduction (1-6), we find the common thread that unifies all the essays or chapters of the volume. The opposition between philosophy and religion, reason and faith expresses the heritage of the Enlightenment that has led philosophical thinking astray, cutting it off from its principal source of inspiration: life, experience, history. Against this background, Peperzak proposes an idea of philosophical reason which is by no means opposed to faith but is rather fundamentally affected, informed, and inspired by a faith whose meaning he sets out to investigate with the help of the "guides" found along the path of philosophy's own history. Philosophy is wisdom, or, better, it is an ongoing "quest" for wisdom and for the meaning of life; it is neither aseptic research nor impersonal doctrine. To this extent, in Peperzak's view, philosophical wisdom is closer to faith than to science. This is certainly the most provocative and indeed debatable thesis of the book. Peperzak draws a distinction "between philosophy as an existential involvement on the way to truth and philosophy in a less committed sense" (9). Thereby, philosophy as way of life is opposed to philosophy as profession. It is Peperzak's aim to bring to light the importance played by philosophy (taken in the first sense) within human life, and to underline the crucial ethical significance that we should recognize to philosophical practice in the contemporary world. In his advocating the fundamental ethical value of all philosophy, the thesis of this volume can be connected to the central argument of Peperzak's most recent book Elements of Ethics (2004).

The notion of faith that we encounter in the different essays of the volume displays two distinct meanings. On the one, more general level, faith is the fundamental trust in reason and the quest for the ultimate meaning of things that we find moving and motivating the thought of all philosophers alike -- pre-Christian, Christian, as well as representative of all world-religions. In this sense, philosophy animated and inspired by faith is opposed to the autarchic view of modernity (and positivism) that restricts reason to scientific rationality. More specifically, however, Peperzak's choice of authors is meant to bring to the fore the (philosophical) significance and specificity of Christian faith. With regard to this issue, he addresses the question of whether and how a Christian can be a philosopher (see chapter 1: Philosophia, and chapter 6: Philosophy and Christianity (An Hour with Pascal)). Endorsing the Christian perspective, Peperzak discusses the relation between Christianity and Platonism (chapter 3: Platonic and Christian Hope), which leads him, for example, to re-read in an innovative way Plato's Phaedo and its thesis of the separation of body and soul. (The claim is that the motivation behind Plato's distinction is "anagogical" instead of merely ontological; it regards a "conversion" or change of attitude with regard to reality as well as to our desires (41). Is this a new, updated Christianization of Plato?). But Peperzak also discusses the first radical break or "historical scission" (51), the one that occurs between Christianity and Judaism (chapter 4: Fulfillment) and sets Christian faith in opposition to different religious traditions.

Thus, Peperzak's discourse proceeds by showing both the fractures or discontinuities occurring in the history of thought because of philosophy's confrontation with Christian faith, and the continuities that philosophical thinking tends to maintain or recreate time and again as it appropriates in a transformative way non-Christian elements, weaving them within new experiential and historical horizons. (The Church Fathers appropriating and transforming Plato and Platonism, Hegel appropriating and transforming Anselm are examples of this procedure). In Peperzak's broad and detailed reconstruction of philosophy's two thoursand years of history, however, there is one exception to this story (and it seems that there is also only one exception). Modern philosophy remains for him the incompatible element that Christian faith cannot assimilate or mediate -- a sort of scandalon in philosophy's history. Pagan Greece is not so foreign to Christian thought in comparison with the scientific, autarchic ideal of reason promoted by modernity. Modern philosophy appears, in this reconstruction, as a 400 years period of philosophical error and darkness. "For 400 years wisdom withdrew from thought because thinking withdrew from spirituality" (20). This may sound as a harsh judgment indeed.

In chapter 8: Life, Science, and Wisdom According to Descartes, we can read by way of sharp contrast Peperzak's own idea of philosophy as a practically and existentially inspired endeavor. The open question, however, remains of whether Peperzak's negative judgment on Descartes is motivated more by Descartes' own distance from the Christian tradition of spirituality embraced by Peperzak than by inner philosophical reasons. On Peperzak's account, with Descartes we reach a radical separation of philosophical thinking from experience and life: thinking is led to the impasse of "the most serious abstraction and death" (129). But can't the story of the Meditationes be interpreted in a certain sense also as the existential story of Descartes' own struggle with doubt? Peperzak's objections against Descartes can be summarized in one central point. Descartes' ideal of philosophy as exact science has made it impossible for him (and for his followers throughout modernity) to develop an ethics that could be more than the abortive attempt at a provisional morality inspired by common sense and respect of conventions in the name of mere utility. To this extent, the idea of philosophy as practical wisdom is lost. Lost, too, is the possibility of thinking of and relating to God in any way other than as a mere "insurer" of propositional truth (147). Theory is separated from practice, science is set above ethics, and ethics loses its position as prima philosophia.

The entire project of modernity hinges on Descartes' starting point, which is the voluntaristic decision to abolish everything that can be doubted "in the name of the desire for certainty" (128). Peperzak's interpretive starting point, on the contrary, is the view that such desire for certainty is an act of hubris that no true philosopher should ever dare perform. Two questions arise, however, at this point. First, on the merely theoretical level, for Descartes the act of abolishing everything that allows for even a minimal possibility of doubt is meant to be in turn a merely provisional act. In the sixth Meditatio the reality of material things, including my body and its sensations, passions, and emotions is recuperated in a new perspective. Shouldn't this turn in Descartes' Meditationes mitigate the judgment on his philosophical project or at least bring us to re-think its overall aim? Second, the separation between theory and practice does not by itself imply a condemnation of ethics or consign it to a secondary role in philosophy. One could simply conclude that Descartes has radically separated knowledge from morals, recognizing the completely different challenges posed to philosophy by ethics. And this would still leave open the conclusion regarding the way in which Descartes would have developed an ethical theory. Peperzak notices that "perhaps Kant and Fichte alone realized that if a true starting point or principle of philosophy is possible, it will necessarily be both theoretical and practical" (133) -- which means that the correction of modernity's failed philosophical project takes place first with Kant and Fichte. But Kant is the philosopher who more than anyone else has stressed the importance of the separation between speculative reason and practical reason as a necessary condition for maintaining the primacy of the practical. Hence it seems that a further argument is needed to prove that Descartes' starting point eo ipso implies a reduction of ethics to insignificance.

The history of philosophy overcomes the Cartesian impasse and finds its inner (spiritual) motivation again in the philosophers of German idealism. The Cartesian temptation of the primacy of theory, however, can be followed up to Hegel's project of an Encyclopaedia of all the philosophical sciences culminating in the highest theoretical idea. Hegel is one of the "guides" of Peperzak's itinerary, and the volume offers us yet another illuminating interpretation of his thought. In chapter 11: Hegel and Modern Culture, Peperzak ultimately presents an important contribution to the question, Why Hegel now? This question has been repeated several times during the last decade and has found an excellent and thorough development in Peperzak's own Modern Freedom: Hegel's Legal, Moral, and Political Philosophy (2001). The interpretation of the relation between human individuality and the encompassing totality of spirit is the center of Peperzak's reconstruction and evaluation of Hegel's ethical project, of his idea of individual freedom, of the relation between philosophy and religion. Peperzak offers an interesting reading of Hegel's Encyclopedia as a "theory of culture" based on the fact that Hegel "considers the world and its history as specifically human and spiritual" (201). Hegel's thematization of modern culture reveals a crucial contradiction of Western culture -- a contradiction that has been more or less directly addressed throughout the volume. "The nationalism of modern states cannot be reconciled with the ideal of fraternal humanity inherited from Christian humanism" (208). This assessment brings us back to one of the initial chapters of the volume in which Plato's Politeia was analyzed in light of a similar tension between ethics (and spirituality) and politics. Although Hegel proposed an Aufhebung of such contradiction in his theory of absolute spirit, Peperzak sees the non-reconciled "tragedy of Western history" mirrored in "the discrepancy between Hegel's theoretical ideal (the perfectly coherent encyclopedia of all that is) and his practical prophecy (the unconquerable particularization of sovereign kingdoms)" (210).

Ultimately, such tension and contradiction is the real challenge of every project of philosophical ethics attempted after modernity. Thereby, Hegel poses a fundamental task to all those who feel a calling to philosophize in the contemporary world.