The Quest for the Good Life: Ancient Philosophers on Happiness

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Øyvind Rabbås, Eyjólfur K. Emilsson, Hallvard Fossheim, and Miira Tuominen (eds.), The Quest for the Good Life: Ancient Philosophers on Happiness, Oxford University Press, 2015, 307pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198746980.

Reviewed by Riin Sirkel, University of Vermont


This volume, containing fourteen papers, focuses on happiness in ancient Greek philosophy. There has been growing interest in happiness and its history within various disciplines like psychology, social sciences, literary studies, as well as in popular culture. Indeed, this shift of interest has been characterized as a "eudaimonic turn", where "eudaimonic" comes from the Greek eudaimonia, standardly translated as "happiness".[1] Thus, the focus of this volume is very much in line with our contemporary interests, but above all it contributes to the scholarship on ancient Greek ethics.

There is an abundance of volumes on ancient ethics, but this one stands out in two ways. Firstly, it is not mainly about Aristotle, who is the canonical figure in ancient ethics, but also includes papers on Plato, Hellenistic schools, the Greek commentators, and Augustine. The inclusion of philosophers of late antiquity deserves special mention, for even though their philosophy represents a crucial link between ancient and medieval philosophy, their ethics has not yet been sufficiently explored. Secondly, this volume takes "the notion of happiness as its primary focus" (5), where the intended contrast is presumably with volumes that focus primarily on virtue or excellence.[2] It is true that of the two central notions of ancient ethics -- eudaimonia or happiness and aretê or virtue -- the scholarly discussions have tended towards virtue, which is encouraged also by the development of virtue ethics. The focus on virtue and virtue ethics has privileged some themes and topics over others, which might help to explain why some themes discussed in this volume (e.g. happiness and time, or happiness as godlikeness) have not received much scholarly attention, although they figure frequently in ancient discussions. The greatest strength of this volume is that by shifting the focus from virtue to happiness it brings to light new issues, topics, and approaches, and shows that ancient ethics is richer, more complex and less homogeneous than is often assumed.

What makes it an interesting volume also makes it difficult to review. To display the diversity of themes and authors, I have included short summaries of all papers, which I have arranged thematically. One of the dominant themes (if not the most dominant theme) of the volume is the relation between happiness and time. I will discuss papers on this theme in slightly greater detail, and then make some evaluative remarks about the volume as a whole. Also, it is worth noting that the volume derives from the project Ethics in Antiquity: The Quest for the Good Life at the Centre for Advanced Study in Oslo, and testifies to the lively interest in eudaemonist ethics in Nordic countries.

For ancient philosophers, eudaimonia is not a particular kind of experience or feeling, but a particular kind of life, where reason almost always plays an important role. The link between happiness and reason is clearly drawn by Aristotle in Nicomachean Ethics (NE) I 7, where he argues that happiness resides in rational activity in accordance with virtue. This argument is discussed by Øyvind Rabbås in "Eudaimonia, Human Nature, and Normativity: Reflections on Aristotle's Project in Nicomachean Ethics Book I". He aims to explain how Aristotle's ethics can be both naturalist and practically normative, i.e. based in a conception of human nature as a rational being, and at the same time give guidance on how we ought to live. The connection between happiness and reason is particularly tight in the Platonist tradition, with Plotinus identifying the happy life with the life of intellect. Plotinus' thoughts on happiness are discussed by Alexandrine Schniewind (and touched upon by Eyjólfur K. Emilsson and Miira Tuominen). Schniewind shows in "Plotinus' Way of Defining 'Eudaimonia' in Ennead I 4 [46] 1-3" that Plotinus' puzzling remarks about his predecessors in the two opening chapters of Ennead I 4 are intended to clear the way for his own definition of happiness.

As well as a connection between happiness and reason, the volume demonstrates that there is a close connection between happiness and godlikeness in ancient ethics. This theme is mentioned in several papers, and taken up in detail by Svavar Hrafn Svavarsson in "On Happiness and Godlikeness before Socrates". Starting from the observation that Plato and Aristotle share the idea that happiness "consists in being as like god as possible" (28), he traces the development of this idea from Homer and Hesiod, through lyric poets, to Heraclitus. He shows how the focus shifts from happiness as external success, entirely dependent on gods, to internal factors responsible for this success. Another significant shift takes place in late antiquity, and is addressed by Christian Tornau in "Happiness in this Life? Augustine on the Principle that Virtue is Self-sufficient for Happiness". Augustine denies the possibility of achieving happiness in this life and regards happiness as a gift of divine grace, but nonetheless holds on to the traditional idea that virtue is sufficient for happiness. Tornau examines his attempt to resolve this dilemma through redefining virtue.

While this volume focuses primarily on happiness, rather than on virtue, the connection between happiness and virtue is an important theme in ancient ethics. Most ancient Greek philosophers agree that in order for one to be happy, one needs to be virtuous, though opinions differ as to whether being virtuous is sufficient for happiness. The Stoics famously take virtue, understood as wisdom, to be sufficient for the happy life, and a common complaint against their account is that the status of the wise person is outside the reach of regular people. Katerina Ierodiakonou's "How Feasible is the Stoic Conception of Eudaimonia?" considers and responds to objections presented by the Stoics' ancient critics. She argues that Stoic moral principles do not rule out moral progress, and their conception of eudaimonia, as an aspiration towards an ideal, is no less feasible than that of other ancient ethical theories. Ierodiakonou's paper is perhaps most directly about virtues, whereas other papers discuss virtues more or less indirectly.

Justice as one of the cardinal virtues is discussed in two papers on Plato's dialogues. In "Wanting to Do What Is Just in the Gorgias", Panos Dimas walks the reader through the Gorgias, and shows that Socrates fails to offer a substantive defense of the view that people want to do what is just, when they know it. Socrates' failure, he proposes, is due to a lack of a positive theory of justice, and the Gorgias may thus be seen as paving the way for the discussion in the Republic. In "Plato's Defence of Justice: The Wrong Kind of Reason?" Julia Annas focuses on Socrates' answer in the Republic to the question of why one should be just. His answer is that being just will lead to living a happy life. Prichard famously complained that this is a wrong kind of answer, since ordinarily people suppose that the reason for being just should not appeal to one's happiness, but to its being the right thing to do. Annas focuses on a recent version of this objection, according to which there are indications in Plato himself that, when defending justice in a eudaemonist way, he is ignoring an alternative answer available to his audience. She offers a close reading of relevant passages, showing that these do not support the "wrong kind of answer" objection. Gösta Grönroos' focus in "Why Is Aristotle's Vicious Person Miserable?" is not on virtue and happy life, but rather on vice and miserable life. He aims to explain why the bad person is miserable, proposes that one reason is her mental conflict, and gives an account of what this conflict amounts to.

Although most ancient philosophers take virtue to be a constituent of happiness, there are also some exceptions. Epicureans take happiness to consist in pleasure, and Dimas' aim in "Epicurus on Pleasure, Desire, and Friendship" is to clarify what being a hedonist amounts to for Epicurus. He argues that Epicurus is a psychological and ethical hedonist, examines his divisions of pleasure and desire, and explains how Epicurus' hedonism fits with his views on virtue and friendship. Also the Pyrrhonian sceptics did not connect happiness with virtue but with the sceptical suspension of belief. The relation between the suspension of belief and happiness as tranquillity is discussed by Svavarsson in "The Pyrrhonian Idea of a Good Life". He discusses four kinds of texts and testimonies on Pyrrhonian tranquillity, with special emphasis on Sextus Empiricus and his perplexing attempt to establish that "the sceptic aims at tranquility but attains it by chance" (197).

Finally, a recurring themee is happiness and time, which deserves special mention. While this theme has received almost no attention from scholars, the papers in this volume demonstrate that it occupies an important role in ancient discussions. In "Aristotle on Happiness and Long Life", Gabriel Richardson Lear gives an interpretation of Aristotle's claim in NE I 7 that happiness requires a complete (or perfect, teleion) life. The same claim is discussed by Emilsson in "On Happiness and Time", where he contrasts the views of Aristotle with post-Aristotelian authors, who give up the complete life requirement. Tuominen considers, in "Why Do We Need Other People to be Happy? Happiness and Concern for Others in Aspasius and Porphyry", the relation between self-interest and concern for others by examining Aspasius' and Porphyry's views. She shows how Aspasius, in commenting on Aristotle's claim in NE I 7, makes the concern for others central for happiness: happiness requires a complete life because one needs to do as much good as possible, also to others. Under this theme may also be subsumed Hallvard Fossheim's "Aristotle on Happiness and Old Age", which discusses (following Aristotle) the impact of old age on virtue and happiness.

At this point I would like to pause, for a moment, to consider proposed interpretations of Aristotle's claim that happiness resides in rational activity "in a complete life", for "one day does not make someone blessed and happy, and neither does a short time" (1098a16-20). On Lear's interpretation, the virtuous activity that constitutes happiness must be something habitual, stable and self-knowing. It takes time for the virtuous activity to become a stable and self-knowing way of life, a person needs "a relatively long time of acting well in order for it to be evident -- to herself and also to her fellow citizens -- that virtuous is what she is" (143). Lear's interpretation implies that the person, who has acquired virtue and acts accordingly, but does it only for a short time (e.g. because she dies young) is not happy (cf. 141). However, this seems counterintuitive, and one is inclined to make the same sort of observation that Lear herself makes earlier in the paper: "Aristotle thinks of the brave person as willing to give up a life that is, in a sense, already happy -- it is precisely for this reason that the prospect of death is painful for him" (137). Yet, her own proposal suggests that the brave person who dies on the battlefield, having obtained the virtue of bravery only recently, would not be considered happy. Emilsson seems to hold (unlike Lear) that we can judge the person who has obtained virtue and acts accordingly to be happy, but we should in our judgement leave open the possibility that things may change in the future. So, we will not judge the person to be happy unconditionally, but "ascribe happiness to a living person who is doing well on the condition that he will stay so till the end and nothing disastrous happens to him" (240). It is not clear how to cash out the details of this proposal, but Emilsson's paper is certainly thought provoking, and together with Lear's, provides a good starting point for further discussions. The same can be said for various other pieces in the volume.

So let me now make some evaluative remarks about the volume as a whole. As the above summaries show, the volume is deep and includes a wide variety of ancient authors. The variety is certainly a strength, but it invokes some questions about the selection of topics. I was left with the lingering question about the role and contribution of Socrates to the ancient eudaemonist tradition, i.e. the tradition that takes eudaimonia as the highest good and ultimate aim of all human endeavor. The volume includes a paper on the Gorgias, and a remark in the introduction that Plato's thought is "a peculiar case in our story" (24). This is because Plato never offers as extensive and systematic treatment of eudaimonia as Aristotle, and yet this topic is "clearly central to his thought" (24), which is then backed up with references to Plato's dialogues, including Socratic dialogues. However, it does not become clear what is the distinctive role of Socrates is this "story", and whether the editors would agree with those authors who take Socrates to be the founder of the eudaemonist tradition.[3] If they would, then wouldn't Socrates deserve more than a passing glance?

Also, the shift of focus from virtue to happiness has advantages that were outlined in the introduction, but placing the primary focus on happiness involves also some potential worries. For instance, even though this volume is about happiness, there's actually not too much discussion about what happiness amounts to, or how to achieve it. The answers to these questions are often just assumed, and the authors move on to discussing some other aspect of the eudaemonist framework. This might be the result of this shift of focus. For most Greek philosophers, the question "What is happiness?" will lead to the discussion of virtue, so it would be difficult to focus on this question without focusing on virtue. Yet, this is what the volume wants to avoid doing. Also, when the editors speak about the goal of the volume, they say that "the first and immediate motivation is to give the reader a sense of how ancient thinkers approached the topic [of happiness and the good life]" (5). Given the importance of virtue in the ancient approach, one wonders whether the volume achieves this aim without placing substantial focus on virtue. Just as the one-sided focus on virtue may hide away some interesting aspects of ancient ethics, there is a corresponding worry that the focus on happiness may paint a one-sided, if not misleading, picture of ancient ethics.

Further, the ancient philosophers' answer to the question "What is happiness?" may be controversial. This is particularly so in the case of Aristotle, who distinguishes between moral virtues and intellectual virtues. His account of happiness in the first books of NE suggests that he ascribes the central role to the former, holding that happiness resides in the morally virtuous action guided by reason, whereas his account in the last book of NE identifies the virtuous activity that constitutes happiness with theoretical contemplation, and it is far from clear how these accounts are supposed to fit together. This difficulty is discussed briefly by Lear, and mentioned by Fossheim, while others rely on one account or other, without making their view explicit. So Grönroos assumes that the virtuous and happy person is morally virtuous, whereas Svavarsson, in claiming that for Aristotle happiness consists in godlikeness, evidently associates happiness with theoretical contemplation. While the expert can orient herself within different interpretations and assumptions, this will be challenging for those not familiar with the issues involved.

Consequently, one might have some worries about accessibility, especially as this volume is intended not only for experts but for non-experts as well. It is true that reading some individual papers may be challenging without background in ancient philosophy, but I would encourage the reader to keep on reading, since the papers nicely contribute to one another, and collectively give the reader a good sense of ancient discussions of happiness. I agree that "there is a lot to be learnt today concerning the nature and content of happiness from proper understanding of the ancient debates" (5). Familiarizing ourselves with these debates makes us better aware of our prejudices concerning happiness, compels us to revise some of our presuppositions (e.g. about the subjectivist nature of happiness), and generally improves our thinking about happiness. So, all in all, I would not go as far as to say that reading this volume will make you happy, but it certainly is a rewarding experience.

[1] See The Eudaimonic Turn: Well-Being in Literary Studies, edited by James O. Pawelski and D. J. Moores, Fairleigh Dickinson University Press, 2014. For a comprehensive account of current happiness research, see Oxford Handbook of Happiness, edited by Susan A. David, Ilona Boniwell, Amanda Conley Ayers, Oxford University Press, 2013.

[2] The editors see Julia Annas' Morality of Happiness (Oxford University Press, 1993) as most closely connected to their project, but add that "even here the focus seems to be more on virtue and morality than on happiness as such" (5).

[3] See, e.g., Terence Irwin, The Development of Ethics: A Historical and Critical Study; Volume 1: From Socrates to the Reformation, Oxford University Press, 2007, esp. pp. 22-23.